To the Best of Our Knowledge: Social Expectations and Epistemic Normativity

Placeholder book cover

Sanford C. Goldberg, To the Best of Our Knowledge: Social Expectations and Epistemic Normativity, Oxford University Press, 2018, 277pp. $46.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198793670.

Reviewed by Allan Hazlett, Washington University in St. Louis


Suppose that you are riding the bus on the way to buy some tortilla chips. You will have to choose between an expensive bag of organic chips or a cheap bag of non-organic chips. Whatever chips you buy will be consumed by your darling daughter, but any money you save will go to her college fund. You suspect, and are inclined to believe, that non-organic foods are unhealthy. You also know that you could find out whether there is any scientific evidence that non-organic foods are unhealthy, and you could do it right now, because your phone is right here. But your phone also has on it a funny game where you pop soap bubbles with a swordfish, the playing of which would be more fun than reading those boring articles about nutrition studies. You could easily play the game, instead of doing the research, and, like Gyges, no one would ever know. So why should you do the intellectually virtuous thing and form your belief about organic food in a careful and conscientious way? Why not just believe on the basis of your evidentially-unsupported suspicion?

That is one way of articulating the basic question about what contemporary epistemologists call "epistemic normativity." The answer, when the question is put this way, is obvious: you should do the research because you owe it to your daughter. And this is the answer that Sandy Goldberg articulates and defends in his new book. He argues that "we expect certain things of each other as epistemic subjects and it is the normativity of those expectations that underwrites the normativity of epistemic assessment." (p. 1) On this view, "epistemic norms . . . are grounded in and reflect the legitimate . . . expectations we have of one another." (p. 2) As obvious as this view is, it is controversial in contemporary epistemology, because many epistemologists argue that epistemic normativity has its source in the nature of belief; their explanations take "the form of an account of doxastic control or doxastic agency." (p. 235)

This is an excellent book, and a welcome contribution to contemporary epistemology. Goldberg does a great job weaving together themes from social epistemology with problems from traditional (i.e. pre-social, late-20th-century) epistemology. His insightful discussion engages with a wide range of topics. The central task of the book is to present and defend an account of epistemic justification, or what Goldberg calls "epistemic propriety" (p. 3), that is designed to incorporate the insights of both externalist and internalist approaches in epistemology (pp. 34-44); this is achieved by requiring, for epistemic propriety, that a belief be formed and sustained both reliably (the externalist insight) and responsibly (the internalist insight) (pp. 118-20). Goldberg also aims for an ecumenical combination of foundationalism and coherentism: although we enjoy default permission to rely on certain reliable cognitive processes (pp. 82-3), epistemic propriety requires that the deliverances of such processes must be monitored for coherence with our other beliefs (pp. 120-6). We also get a novel account of normative defeat (pp. 191-225). Goldberg comes as close as one could to providing a "complete" epistemology, providing or suggesting answers to the bulk of the central questions in epistemology. As I have suggested, his sensitivity to insights on both sides of some traditional epistemological debates makes his conclusions much more plausible than those defended by closed-minded partisans. I dare say that not much more ink needs to be spilled over the internalism-externalism controversy, given Goldberg's elegant synthesis.

Goldberg is a careful and rigorous philosopher, and his discussion often descends into the details, defining a litany of terms and articulating various principles with analytical precision. Whether you find this it to be a virtue or a vice will largely depend on taste, and how you balance the values of precision and elegance. I'm going to try to abstract away from a lot of those details here, in an attempt to give a broad-strokes sketch of what the book is all about, and in particular of Goldberg's account of epistemic normativity in terms of social expectations.

What is most exciting about Goldberg's account is what he calls the "order of explanation thesis." (p. 2, pp. 147-9) Just as Euthyphro asked whether the gods love the pious because it is pious or, rather, the pious is pious because it is loved by the gods, we can ask (p. 147) whether we are entitled to expect others to conform to the epistemic standards because they are the epistemic standards or, rather, whether the epistemic standards are the epistemic standards because they are the things to which we are entitled to expect others to conform. The "natural" answer is that the prior existence of the epistemic standards explains why we are entitled to expect people to conform to them: we are entitled to expect people to be intellectually virtuous because they ought to be intellectually virtuous. Goldberg's "radical" proposal is that the order of explanation is the other way around: our prior entitlement to expect people to conform to such-and-such standards explains the existence of those standards: we ought to be intellectually virtuous because people are entitled to expect us to be.

So the question now becomes: why are we entitled to expect people to conform to the epistemic standards? But with a distinctive caveat: we need an explanation that "makes no reference to pre-existing epistemic standards." (p. 150) Although Goldberg does not emphasize this point, there is an obvious reason why such an account of epistemic normativity is appealing: the existence of "epistemic standards" is utterly mysterious, both metaphysically and conceptually, so if we can explain their existence in terms of something non-mysterious, we will have made significant philosophical progress.

So we need an account of our entitlement to expect people to conform to epistemic standards. Two points of clarification are needed. First, the expectations in question are "normative," rather than predictive: we expect other people to be intellectually virtuous, not in the sense that we believe it likely that they will be intellectually virtuous, but in the sense that we evaluate them relative to this criterion (pp. 65-6). Second, we are concerned only with "epistemic" expectations, i.e. those that we have "of one another in relation to our attempts (in mental representation) at truth and the avoidance of error." (p. 25; note that "epistemic expectations" is used in a different way on p. 66) One corollary of this is that the relevant expectations concern only how others "go about their business forming, sustaining, and revising their system of beliefs," (p. 151) and not their actions or emotions in general (cf. p. 243). Another corollary of this, to which I will return in what follows, is that the relevant expectations take for granted the normativity of the "truth goal," i.e. the aim of having true beliefs and not having false beliefs.

Goldberg posits two species of normative epistemic expectations. The first are "basic epistemic expectations," to which we are entitled "merely in virtue of the fact that we are epistemic subjects who depend on one another for information about our shared world." (p. 150; cf. p. 158) In this connection, we expect people to rely only on reliable processes (of belief formation, sustainment, and revision) and to be minimally responsible in monitoring the outputs of such processes for incoherence (pp. 151-2). But now the crucial question: why are we entitled to these expectations? Are these expectations legitimate or justified? Tyrants expect their subjects to obey, but that expectation alone does not explain the existence of a "tyrannical standard," entailing that their subjects ought to obey. In answer to this question, Goldberg offers a pair of transcendental arguments (pp. 153-7). Calling into question our entitlement to our basic epistemic expectations, first, "calls into question something that is part and parcel of our everyday practice of relying on others' testimony," (p. 153) and would thus "undermine the rationale for a core part of our epistemic (information-gathering) practices as a social species." (p. 154) And calling into question said entitlement, second, "calls into question the rationale for our practical engagements with one another." (p. 156) Both the rationale for our information-gathering practices and for our practical engagements presuppose "the legitimacy of our holding each other to certain epistemic standards." (p. 157) Therefore, we are entitled to hold each other to those standards -- unlike the tyrant, who is not entitled to expect obedience. And, therefore, said epistemic standards exist, i.e. they are real or genuine standards -- unlike the bogus "tyrannical standard."

The second species of normative epistemic expectations are "general epistemic expectations" that are relative to particular "social-epistemic roles." (p. 161) These include professional roles (e.g. pp. 162-3), institutional roles (e.g. we expect the head of an academic department to be familiar with departmental policies, pp. 163), service-provider roles (e.g. we expect teachers to listen to their students and take their concerns seriously, p. 163), and interpersonal roles (e.g. we expect our partner to check the "family notes" whiteboard on the fridge, pp. 164-5. Goldberg's argument is that these expectations are partly constitutive of various social practices. However, we are entitled to said expectations only if said practices are legitimate, he argues, which prompts the question of the legitimacy of the relevant social practices (pp. 165-9). He gives an account of this, on which a social practice is legitimate if and only if it is ongoing or recognized, has widely acknowledged standards, and has not been seriously challenged (p. 169-70), and later implies that legitimacy, so understood, ensures that a practice is neither immoral nor unfair (p. 247). However, that an epistemic expectation is partly constitutive of a legitimate social practice is necessary, but not sufficient, for our being entitled to it. What is required, in addition to such legitimacy, is that "the epistemic standards of the practice are reliability-conducive with respect to the doxastic states of those being assessed." (pp. 170-1) According to Goldberg, our epistemic expectations are legitimate only if "having them serves the purpose of enhancing the prospects for the acquisition of epistemically high-quality belief." (p. 171)

But this appeal to "epistemically high-quality belief" is unacceptable in this context, for we swore off any such appeal when we set out to explain our entitlement to expect people to conform to the epistemic standards without appeal to the prior existence of those standards (see above). We set out to explain why people ought to form their beliefs in reliable ways, by appeal to other people's entitlement to expect them to do so. But now, to explain that very entitlement, we have appealed to the normativity of reliable belief formation. And I do not see any way to justify his reliability requirement without undermining his radical "order of explanation thesis." Moreover, the same worry applies to Goldberg's account of our entitlement to basic epistemic expectations, given his assumption of the normativity of the truth goal. That account assumes "our interest in acquiring truths and avoiding falsehoods," (p. 158) simply as a consequence of the fact that we are concerned with "epistemic" normativity. However, at least one "pre-existing" epistemic standard -- the principle that true belief is good and false belief is bad -- is being used as a premise in our explanation of epistemic normativity. This threatens to dull the impact of the seemingly radical order of explanation thesis. (It also threatens to dull the impact of the move to an account in terms of social expectations, since we remain in need of an account of the normativity of the truth goal, which may well come by appeal to the nature of belief and the issues of doxastic control and agency that Goldberg had hoped to set aside.)

Note well that the appeal to the normativity of the truth goal is playing a crucial role in the account. We cannot, for example, appeal merely to human nature -- e.g. to the fact that our dependence on one another is "ineliminable" given "our natures as epistemic subjects." (p. 150-1) This non-normative fact is not the right sort of thing to explain the normative status of our epistemic expectations. This might explain why we inevitably do expect certain conduct from one another, but not why we are entitled to do so.[1]

Here is one final concern. An explanation of epistemic normativity in terms of social expectations is quite plausible in the case of the tortilla chips (above). But what happens when we remove those expectations? Suppose that, rather than heading to the store to buy your daughter some chips, you are heading back to your bachelor pad after your parents' funeral -- or, I suppose, to guarantee complete social isolation, from the end of the world. And suppose that, rather than deciding what to believe about the health benefits of organic food, you are deciding what to believe about the number of motes of dust on the seat next to you, having casually decided to count them for no reason at all. Again you have a choice: you can count the motes carefully (i.e. in a reliable way) or sloppily (i.e. in an unreliable way). And, again, you are like Gyges: if you choose to form your belief on the basis of a sloppy count, no one will ever find out. Why, in that case, should you not do so?

It is tempting to say that in this case you have no good reason not to form your belief in an unreliable way. Such a belief, formed in solitude and concerning a trivial question, lies outside the scope of epistemic evaluation, once we recognize that epistemic evaluation is social and practical in the ways implied by Goldberg's account. Even if formed unreliably, then, it is not unjustified, irrational, or prohibited. Goldberg persuasively argues that an individual, even a solitary individual, can have expectations of themselves (pp. 237-9), but I don't think that changes things in this case. Granted: I owe it to my future self to count carefully how many blood pressure pills I take, since my future self rightly expects me to transmit reliable information to him in the form of memories about how many pills we have taken today. But my future self couldn't care less about the number of motes on the seat of the bus.

[1] Note also that our social nature leaves open a wide range of possibilities when it comes to our expectations vis-à-vis other people's intellectual conduct: we used to expect people to know their way around the places they lived; now we just use our phones.