Tolerance among the Virtues

Placeholder book cover

John R. Bowlin, Tolerance among the Virtues, Princeton University Press, 2016, 265pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691169972.

Reviewed by Iskra Fileva, University of Colorado, Boulder


There is a popular view of tolerance -- perhaps more frequently accepted implicitly than argued for -- on which tolerance is an idiosyncrasy of liberal societies. Most societies, this story goes, are intolerant: they attempt to regulate too much of our personal lives and end up meddling with what is best left to individual choice -- religion, clothing, hairstyles, and so on. Liberal societies, by contrast, leave such aspects of life as religion or dress up to the individual. The locus classicus for this view of tolerance is probably John Locke's Letter Concerning Toleration. In that piece, Locke endorses religious diversity, arguing that spiritual salvation is none of the state's business. Ever since Locke, we have been adding items to the list of things to be tolerated: sexual orientation, gender identity, abortion, and so on, all in the service of the liberal value of autonomy.

Tolerance thus understood has occasioned attitudes ranging anywhere from admiration to ambivalence and resentment. Objections come from all sides. On the one hand, those who are expected to tolerate may prefer not to restrain their outrage in the face of what they perceive as others' objectionable choices. On the other hand, the tolerated may see tolerance as a condescending attitude: they may wish to be accepted, or even have their choices celebrated, rather than merely tolerated. In addition, those whose choices do not end up on the liberal list of things to be tolerated may come to suspect that it is not autonomy that matters to a liberal society at all, but rather, keeping one's choices in line with the list sanctioned by liberal sensibilities.

John R. Bowlin's book tells a different story, meant in part to parry some of these objections, and in part to provide what he sees as a better account of tolerance. On the view Bowlin develops, tolerance is a "natural" virtue. The basic idea is the following: there is indeterminacy to the human good and a diversity of possible loves and goods that humans pursue. A concern with justice arises out of this indeterminacy and this diversity: we want to give each other what each is due. Sometimes, what another is due is patient endurance of her choices and the pursuit of her loves. Tolerance is the virtue of reacting with patient endurance in the right sorts of circumstances. Tolerance is thus a part of justice. It is a perfection of our responses to the differences of others, and more particularly, to objectionable differences. It enables us to achieve peace and give to each other what each is due. The tolerant respond with patient endurance without either resentment or desire to express their outrage. Finally, in order for tolerance to be a virtue of character, it must become habitual. Bowlin writes, "The virtuous consider themselves obliged to respond with patient endurance to at least some objectionable differences" (102). And later, "[The truly tolerant] object to the right differences, intend the right ends, take note of the right circumstances, and respond with the right actions, all with the ease of habit" (165).

As the last sentence suggests, Bowlin acknowledges that tolerance is not always the right response to objectionable differences. It is only the right response in the right circumstances. Some things are intolerable, and those things ought not to be tolerated. One example given by Bowlin involves tolerating the objectionable musical tastes of one's teenage son: tolerance is the virtuous response to objectionable musical taste. But were one's son, by contrast, to get involved with drug dealing, one would be well-advised to intervene, coercively if necessary. Such an intervention would be just what is required in order to give one's son what he is due: a parent who lets his or her son go down the path of self-destruction is not being tolerant -- he or she is being a bad parent.

The heroes of Bowlin's story are not thinkers such as Locke and Mill, but Aquinas and, to a lesser extent, Wittgenstein. Aquinas did not focus much on tolerance, but he developed an Aristotelian account of virtue on which virtue is natural in the sense that virtues derive their desirability and advisability from their connection to the final end human beings naturally pursue: namely, happiness or eudaimonia. There is another layer to Aquinas's theory -- as a Christian theologian, Aquinas sought to connect the Aristotelian account of virtue to Christian theology and pronounced union with God to be the supreme final end and complete happiness. Bowlin is sympathetic to that aspect of Aquinas's view, but the account of tolerance he puts forth can be assessed without reference to its Christian underpinnings, and it is Bowlin's hope that secular authors would so assess it.

Bowlin also draws on Wittgenstein, whom he interprets through a Thomistic lens. According to Wittgenstein, the acceptance of certain moral and ontological commitments is part and parcel of linguistic competence. Thus, if I asked you what 'justice' means, and you told me it is the value embodied by an authoritarian dictator's rule, I would conclude either that you are not answering my question in earnest or else that you do not know what 'justice' means. I would have a similar reaction if I asked you for an example of a human vice and you said "tolerance." A speaker and member of a moral community competent with the concepts of justice and tolerance would, on Bowlin's view, see tolerance as a virtue and as a part of justice, and would see the precepts of justice -- including its link to tolerance -- as "the grammatical rules that govern our use of the concept" (256).

Bowlin's book is thoughtful and the account put forth original. Whatever else you may think of his proposal, you are unlikely to think it is "more of the same." The book is also very well-written. It immediately draws the reader in, as Bowlin starts with a fascinating personal anecdote involving a trip to rural Oklahoma, where Bowlin went to see a cockfight. He wanted to know whether or not to vote for banning cockfights. He went thinking he would find the practice objectionable but tolerable yet left thinking it intolerable. He returns to this episode in the epilogue, where he reflects on the complexities of the situation, and on the perspective of the people whose traditional practices are pronounced unacceptable by the rest of society.

I found myself having a lot of sympathy with the attempt to understand tolerance from a virtue ethics perspective. Tolerance must be a "natural virtue" at least in the following sense: there are and have been tolerant people in intolerant societies, and those people had a virtue. For instance, in George Eliot's novel Adam Bede, a female Methodist preacher named Dinah Morris provides comfort to a young woman guilty of infanticide when others are judgmental. In fact, the young woman in question refuses to acknowledge her guilt throughout the trial, but she tells Dinah everything, because she has the intuitive feeling that Dinah won't abandon her as others might. Indeed, Dinah helps cultivate tolerance in others, since most people at the time do not accept female preachers, but some change their minds about the issue as a result of interacting with the compassionate and virtuous Dinah.

The first thing I would note, however, is that an account of tolerance as a virtue of character is not a substitute for an account of tolerance as a societal value. In that sense, Bowlin's proposal is not so much an alternative to the traditional view as an account of a slightly different (and perhaps unjustly neglected) aspect of tolerance. What would tolerance as a societal value look like, on Bowlin's reckoning? He does not exactly tell us, but I suppose the answer is this: our society will be tolerant (and in just the right ways) if we all try to cultivate the virtue of tolerance. And if we do, we will not feel resentment at the thought of tolerating the objectionable differences of others, for the truly tolerant act wholeheartedly and without resentment. But this is where Bowlin's departure from the traditional liberal view -- which is, in one way, the book's chief advantage -- becomes a liability. Plainly, not everyone in society is interested in cultivating the virtue of tolerance, or any other virtue for that matter. A student of mine once wrote in an essay on Aristotle (paraphrasing), "I don't know whether being virtuous is my main goal. I don't know whether it is one of my goals at all. I want to be successful and loved -- those are my goals." I have no way of knowing just how common this response is, but I would conjecture that it is not uncommon. And yet, we need to keep our society tolerant, and perhaps to make it more tolerant than it currently is, even if most of us are not interested in cultivating the virtue of tolerance. The traditional liberal view seems on firmer grounds here: whatever is not forbidden by law is permitted and ought to be tolerated, even by those who would rather have others make different choices. A society can embody the value of tolerance even if many -- perhaps most -- of its members cannot get themselves to acquire the corresponding virtue. I have no doubt that there may be societies where, say, homosexuality is illegal but there are people who not only tolerate a plurality of sexual orientations but also shield homosexuals from legal prosecution We cannot, however, rely on the individual virtue of individual people. We need norms -- both formal and informal -- that prohibit discrimination. Toleration is too important to the peace and prosperity of society to be left up to individual virtue.

A second problem, I think, is Bowlin's definition of tolerance as a particular kind of response -- namely, patient endurance -- to objectionable difference. Tolerance may be required even when another's choice is not truly objectionable. There are different reasons why this may be so. For instance, a person may do something that would be irritating to most others, but the kind of behavior may not be voluntary, as when a spouse snores while sleeping. Second, we may find that another's taste grates on us -- for instance, a graduate student at the Arts Academy may find the Kincaid painting hanging in the living-room of the apartment she's rented so cloying that looking at it is painful. Yet surely a Kincaid painting is not truly objectionable -- that is, not objectionable in a moral sense.

There is a final point I wish to make here. I found Bowlin's account slightly too flattering to the reader. He often invites us to imagine tolerating this or that, as a virtuous person would. But he never invites us to imagine that someone tolerates us. For me, the knowledge that some tolerant people may be patient with me without my knowing it, refraining from telling me that some behavior of mine is irritating to them, is a key motivation in my attempt to be tolerant in turn. Consider again Bowlin's example involving his teenage son. It seems to never occur to Bowlin that it may be just as difficult for a teenage son to listen to the music his parents play as it is for them to listen to his. Thomas Schelling made this point once:

Our chamber music annoys the teenager as much as her rap music bothers us. We rarely ask our neighbors what color they would like us to paint our houses. Some of us smoke and used to inflict disagreeable or toxic substances on others in elevators; some of us quit and chew gum, which may smell as bad as cigarette smoke.[1]

[1] Thomas Schelling, Strategies of Commitment (Harvard University Press, 2007), p. 167.