Tolerance and the Ethical Life

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Andrew Fiala, Tolerance and the Ethical Life, Continuum, 2005, 208pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826478441.

Reviewed by Rebecca Stangl, University of Virginia


In Tolerance and the Ethical Life, Andrew Fiala argues for two major claims, one interpretive and one normative. Against those who see in Western thinking an essentially intolerant enterprise, Fiala argues that this tradition has a deep core commitment to the virtue of tolerance. This commitment, he also argues, is a good one; tolerance is not merely a concession to the fact of social disagreement, but a positive ethical ideal to which we ought to aspire. As Fiala develops his overall argument, the defense of these claims is intimately connected. Fiala not only mines an impressive array of historical figures in order to show their shared commitment to the ideal of tolerance, but does so in order to suggest that there is, more often than not, something right about this commitment and their various arguments in defense of it.

Fiala's exploration into the source and value of tolerance begins with a model. The figure of Socrates -- as he appears in the early Platonic dialogues, at least -- provides both the inspiration for Fiala's account of the virtue, and illustrates its attractiveness. Socrates' tolerance derives both from his belief in his own ignorance and his confidence in the power of reason. What Socrates teaches us is that tolerance is necessary for creatures like us -- finite and fallible -- who nonetheless love the truth and seek to discover it. By tolerating others whose views on the good life differ radically from our own, we are enabled to enter into a dialogue with them about the good and so further our own quest for the truth.

With this Socratic picture in mind, Fiala devotes the second chapter of the book to giving a more precise definition of the virtue of tolerance. To have the virtue of tolerance, he tells us, is to possess the disposition to engage in acts of toleration. To engage in acts of toleration, moreover, can be defined in the following way:

When I tolerate something:

I have a negative judgment about this thing (usually a person or his activities, where activity is broadly conceived to include the actions, attitudes, and habits of persons).

I could negate this thing.

I deliberately refrain from negating this thing.

The negative judgment in question, Fiala goes on to explain, is neither outright disapproval nor outright approval. If it were the latter, then tolerance would not be called for and, if the former, then tolerance would be impossible. Thus, the negative judgment in question is midway between approval and disapproval; it can be anywhere on a continuum from disgust (at the negative end) to mere non-approving indifference (at the positive end). The second condition on something counting as tolerance is that I have it in my power to negate the thing in question, where such negation encompasses mere avoidance to violent destruction. Finally, I must refrain from engaging in these acts of negation, and do so for good reasons.

Fiala focuses each of the next four chapters on the endorsement, and defense, of the virtue of tolerance in the work of four different thinkers and/ or philosophical traditions. Drawing on the work of Martin Buber, and its recent elaboration by David Norton, chapter three argues that tolerance can be derived from an appreciation of our own fallibility and finitude. To adequately judge another, I must be able to appreciate his actions from his point of view. But, given the limit of my own moral imagination, I can never be sure that I am doing this. Thus, I have reason to be wary of judging others too quickly, and so should err on the side of tolerating them. Chapter four adds to this appreciation of our own fallibility the Stoic claim that others' opinions, actions, and behaviors are not under our control. Tolerating others, therefore, is an important way in which we exercise self-control over our emotions by refusing to be disturbed or angered by their behavior.

In chapters five and six, Fiala draws on the emphasis in early modern philosophy and various forms of existentialism on the value of inward sincerity. Part of what it means to be human, and part of what gives being human a special dignity, is that we are each capable of forming our own beliefs on the basis of reason. Given the uncertainty of life and the under-determination of the idea of the good, however, there is no guarantee that we will all come to the same conclusions. Tolerating others who come to different conclusions about the good life, therefore, is one way in which I extend to them the respect which their human dignity demands. Such an argument for tolerance, Fiala is quick to assure us, does not imply that we ought to tolerate just anything. Those who would resort to violence in an attempt to convert others to their religious or moral ideals, for example, need not be tolerated. In general, those who refuse to tolerate any dissent from their own favored conception of the good life thereby step outside the bounds of the tolerable and need not be tolerated by the rest of us.

Chapters seven and eight, finally, turn from the issue of toleration as a personal virtue to the related question of political toleration. In chapter seven, Fiala focuses on Mill's epistemological argument for tolerance, but seems to reject it in unrevised form. Agreeing with Waldron, and against Mill, Fiala worries that the argument depends upon the false assumption that belief cannot be coerced. What Mill should have said, Fiala claims, is not that it is impossible to coerce belief, but that we ought not to. A purely political argument for tolerance, however, can be found in pragmatic considerations. Thus, in chapter eight, Fiala draws on the work of Rawls to argue that tolerance can be justified merely on the pragmatic grounds that diversity in our views of the good is simply inevitable. If we are to avoid the horrors of sectarian wars and coercive state practices, then tolerance is, if nothing else, a practical necessity.

Fiala's book, as this summary should make clear, ranges very widely over the history of Western thought. This is, in one sense, an important strength of the book. Fiala does an admirable job of demonstrating the deep roots of tolerance in the Western intellectual tradition and its compatibility with a number of extremely different approaches to philosophy. This is a welcome contribution to the discussion of the source of the ideal of tolerance, a discussion which has often made it seem as if tolerance is a peculiarly modern virtue, which came to the fore only in the wake of the disastrous religious wars of the sixteenth century.

On the other hand, such wide scope -- perhaps inevitably -- tends to mean that each individual argument is often treated with less detail than some readers may like. Chapter five, for example, attempts to locate the varying reasons that Descartes, Spinoza, Rousseau, Emerson, James, Royce, and Marcel had for endorsing the virtue of tolerance, and does this in twenty-two pages. The result is that there is less work done to show exactly what each author meant when he wrote in defense of tolerance, or how his views on tolerance connected with his larger moral and political ideals. As Fiala himself recognizes, however, defining tolerance is no easy matter. Given that Fiala draws on historical figures not only to show that they were committed to some form of tolerance, but also to show that their arguments in defense of this commitment can be drawn on to defend his account of tolerance, one concern this raises is whether the authors in question were, in fact, committed to the same virtue which Fiala wants to defend and, if not, whether their arguments nonetheless support his conclusion.

A related concern I have with the book is its combination of interpretive and normative aims. It was not always clear to me, for example, whether Fiala's discussion of a particular figure was meant only to support the interpretive claim, or the normative one as well. One example of this is Fiala's discussion of the Stoics: Fiala is quite right to note that one of the Stoics' main reasons for recommending that we tolerate the bad behavior of others is that it is beyond our control. However, as he also notes, another one of their reasons for recommending tolerance is that all evil, on their view, is merely a result of ignorance. When faced with evil, therefore, we ought to reason with the offender, without becoming angry with her. Suppose, though, that we do not accept the claim that all evil derives from ignorance. Might the Stoic case for tolerance not be significantly weakened? An answer to this question, I take it, would have significantly clarified Fiala's own stance in relation to the Stoics. None of this, of course, touches on Fiala's interpretive claim that the sources of tolerance are deep in the western tradition. It may, however, limit the normative relevance of the Stoic argument.

Finally, let me raise a few questions about Fiala's definition of tolerance. I had a number of concerns about his definition, two of which I will comment on here. First, it is not clear to me why Fiala thinks that the negative judgment which the tolerant person possesses cannot be outright disapproval. Perhaps I genuinely disapprove of the action in question but simply have other considerations, such as respect for the other person's autonomy, which prevent me from interfering with her behavior. Suppose, for example, that someone I love very much refuses to quit her heavy smoking habit. I might have very strong reasons to disapprove of such a habit, and yet tolerate it nonetheless. Such toleration might be justified by an appeal to any number of considerations, ranging from a high-minded respect for her autonomy to a down-to-earth evaluation of the likely counter-productive effects of nagging. None of these considerations, however, need suggest any diminution of my disapproval of smoking; they are simply considerations of another kind.

Second, Fiala's definition of "negating," in my view, is too broad to serve the purpose at hand. "Negating," as Fiala uses the term, includes not only interfering with another's right to practice a behavior, but also mere "avoidance" of the person or action in question. It seems, though, too strong a demand to put on the tolerant person that he refrain even from avoiding those behaviors or persons that he tolerates. Suppose, for example, that I believe that virtually all pornography is degrading to women, and therefore avoid it in every possible respect; I don't buy it, I don't look at it, perhaps I even try to avoid patronizing shops which sell it. Nonetheless, and for independent reasons, I do not support the criminalization of pornography or any civil penalties against those who produce or use it. In such a case, it seems to me, it would be perfectly reasonable to say that I tolerate pornography and those who produce it. Requiring, in addition, that I not avoid pornography and/or pornographers is to require too much; it is to move beyond a demand for tolerance towards a demand for respect. Tolerating Larry Flynt may very well mean that I cannot push for his imprisonment, but I see no reason why it should require me to have him over for dinner.

These worries are not unrelated, in my view, to Fiala's choice of Socrates as his guiding model of tolerance, and the participants in a Socratic dialogue as his models for a tolerant community. There is undeniably something attractive about the tolerant acceptance that Socrates extends to his interlocutors, and the pursuit of truth that this tolerance enables. But the virtue of tolerance is a moral ideal that must also serve us in less exalted circumstances. Respect for the autonomy of others may very well require us to tolerate not only confused interlocutors, but more offensive characters altogether. And that arguably requires a more capacious model of tolerance than the one Fiala recommends.

For this reason, and the reasons noted above, Fiala's normative argument in defense of tolerance seems to me lacking in important respects. This fact, however, does not detract from the importance of the topic it addresses, nor does it mean that the book is without interest. In particular, Fiala has made an important contribution to our understanding of the deep and varied history of the moral ideal of tolerance.