Toleration: A Critical Introduction

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Catriona McKinnon, Toleration: A Critical Introduction, Routledge, 2006, 218pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415322901.

Reviewed by Duncan Ivison, University of Sydney


Toleration is often thought to be caught between paradox and redundancy. To be tolerant means, very generally, to put up with what you oppose, or to not interfere with or suppress a practice or belief that you could if you wanted to (because you have the power or influence etc.). It can seem paradoxical because toleration occurs only when you put up with something that you disapprove of on some defensible evaluative ground (i.e. is not mere dislike): If you have a morally justified belief that a practice is wrong (leaving aside, for now, exactly what constitutes a belief being morally justified), then it might seem to follow that you should not, in principle, tolerate that practice. We can't be said to tolerate something unless we oppose it on the basis of sound evaluative reasons, and yet we shouldn't tolerate it because it violates those reasons. On the other hand, toleration might seem redundant: If I have a commitment that ought to be acted on, then toleration is inappropriate. If it ought not to be acted on, then my opposition is inappropriate. Thus either my actions are compatible with justice or they are not, and therefore someone's opposition is either justified or it is not. There is no space between the reasons I have for thinking an action just (or unjust) and those which I tolerate (or not).

But toleration is neither paradoxical nor redundant, and indeed is now even more vital to our politics -- both local and global -- than ever before, and yet in worryingly short supply.[1] Worsening relations between different religious and ethnic groups within liberal democratic states, as well as elsewhere, seem to be on the rise. The fragile consensus, if there ever was one, on the value of official multiculturalism is fracturing under various strains. And, of course, the 'war on terror' is generating enormous ill-will and tension between predominantly Muslim states and the United States and its allies. So Catriona McKinnon's lively, accessible and broad-ranging introduction to toleration is very welcome indeed. As she puts it, there is a danger of complacency creeping into contemporary liberal democratic attitudes towards toleration: We all say we believe in it and yet our actions often betray our apparent beliefs, and we lose sight of the need to defend toleration in the face of attacks from all sides. Early on in the book she notes:

If anything is a fact about human nature and its operation on a bounded planet with limited resources then this is: conflict between persons is a permanent feature of their interaction in social contexts … [and] many [such] conflicts cannot be resolved without remainder via procedural means. (6-7)

Hence the need for toleration. This link between toleration and conflict, part of what McKinnon calls the 'circumstances of toleration' seems absolutely right to me, and is an important aspect of any properly political theory of toleration. (It's a connection that Rainer Forst has also made recently in his equally impressive Toleranz im Konflict[2].)

The book is structured conventionally between theory and practice: A survey of different philosophical approaches to toleration is followed by a close examination of various cases in situ: culture and citizenship (including the French 'headscarves affair' and debates over female circumcision), artistic expression (including the Rushdie affair), pornography and Holocaust denial. But happily the discussion isn't all description. In the course of her survey, McKinnon traces and then defends, very skillfully, the outline of her preferred argument for toleration, which she calls the 'reasonableness defence', based mainly on a form of Rawlsian constructivism.

Before turning to some of the details of this argument, let me say something more about the general concept of tolerance. If tolerance means, very generally, putting up with what you oppose, then there are clearly going to be different conceptions of what this entails. One aspect of answering this question will involve making sense of which values toleration is most closely related to, or depends upon: For example, is it freedom, autonomy, equal respect or justice, or some complex bundle of these concepts? Toleration is, as McKinnon and others have pointed out, a normatively dependent concept. It doesn't come in at the ground floor but is rather closely related to, and arguably even derivative of, other important values. There is nothing about tolerance itself, for example, that warrants respect for difference (as the history of the emergence of religious toleration clearly shows). This is one reason why toleration doesn't entail relativism (or vice versa), as McKinnon demonstrates in her crisp dissection of arguments purporting to show that it does (Chapter 2). Conceptions of toleration run along at least two general axes, the first between negative and more expansive conceptions, and the second between moral and political conceptions. A negative conception of toleration, for example with regard to religion, has no necessary implication that the ultimate truth of the faith is unknown, or that religious dissidence should be encouraged, but only that sanctions against dissidents should be mitigated (e.g. because faith can't and shouldn't be coerced). A more expansive conception builds on a recognition of the fact that people hold different moral views and live different ways of life and yet find peaceful ways of living together without enforced conformity. From here it is a short step to seeing toleration as more than just about restraint, but also about the fostering and promotion of diversity and non-conformity as a means to human self-improvement. Moral arguments for toleration focus on the kinds of principles or norms people ought to follow when deciding whether to interfere with practices or beliefs they abhor. Within these, there are differences between, for example, Kantian and utilitarian approaches.[3] Political arguments for toleration focus more on the need to preserve or promote civil order and political stability, or rest on a general attitude towards the exercise of political power. These different lines can then be brought together in different combinations as conceptions of toleration: negative and political (e.g. Hobbes and Pufendorf), or expansive and moral (Mill, Rawls). Moral arguments can be more and less politically oriented, and vice versa. Negative arguments can have positive consequences. The interesting arguments, of course, will be found at the overlap between these different axes.

McKinnon finds what I have called political toleration, or toleration as modus vivendi, too thin and unstable, in part because the principles are not 'guaranteed' (p. 70):

if a person previously limited in her power over others suddenly gains much more power then prudence might dictate that she no longer tolerate people she has hitherto restrained herself from interfering with. (p. 16; see also pp. 69-70)

A 'moral requirement' for toleration, as she puts it, is less sensitive to such changes in circumstances. But this raises the stakes in terms of what counts as a genuinely moral argument for toleration, especially given the 'circumstances of toleration'. As McKinnon herself summarizes it:

What we want is a justification fit to convince A who hates homosexuals and what they do, and who has the power to make gay sex a crime, that she ought not to wield this power on principled grounds. (p. 42)

But what counts as 'principled' and what kind of justification will do the job? After surveying various possibilities, including arguments based on scepticism (meta-ethical and epistemological) and value-pluralism (Berlin and Raz) and finding both wanting, McKinnon opts for Rawlsian 'reasonableness'. This isn't surprising, given the way she sets up the problem, and also because of the centrality of toleration to Rawls's argument in Political Liberalism. There are two aspects of Rawlsian reasonableness that McKinnon focuses on: First, that people have the capacity for a sense of justice, and second, that they accept the 'burdens of judgment'. To be reasonable, in the first sense, means to be committed to public reason: to be ready to propose, or to acknowledge when proposed by others, principles needed to specify what could be accepted by all as fair terms of social cooperation. To be reasonable in the second sense means to accept the consequences of the free exercise of reason, namely, the permanence (in a democratic society, at least) of 'reasonable disagreement'. Under the political and social conditions secured by the free institutions of such a society, a diversity of conflicting but 'reasonable' comprehensive doctrines will come about. What makes them 'reasonable'? Basically, the acceptance that although I may believe my comprehensive doctrine to be true, given the fact that others hold very different views about the ultimate nature of the good or justice, I can't expect to justify the exercise of the coercive power of the state on my terms alone. I accept that we'll need to find some kind of 'overlapping consensus' upon which to do so -- hence Rawls's 'political conception of justice'. Now McKinnon places particular weight upon acceptance of the 'burdens of judgment' in this Rawlsian story. These are the conditions in which modern citizens reason about important public matters: they include, among other things, the fact that our concepts and even the empirical evidence bearing on particular questions can be inconclusive and vague; that we can disagree about the relative weight to be assigned to various relevant considerations; and that the way we assess evidence and weigh moral and political values is shaped by our 'total experience, our whole course of life', and that this will obviously generate great differences between people. All of this means that conscientious, rational people, even after being presented with the relevant evidence and considerations, may still arrive at very different conclusions about important moral and political questions. This leads to the conclusion, then, that reasonable people will accept a limit on the exercise of political power based on their acceptance of reasonable pluralism. Accepting the burdens of judgment entails endorsing political toleration (73-4).

Of course, one problem with adopting this approach is that it lands McKinnon in the large debate over the plausibility of Rawls's appeal to reasonableness, which many find deeply problematic. The basic problem is that it is notoriously difficult to make sense of the reasonable as any kind of independent standard to use in the context of disagreements over the justification of the coercive power of the state. To put it crudely: who decides (or how) what is reasonable and unreasonable, and how can we justify where the line is drawn that doesn't require basically accepting much of what is already at issue in disagreements between people with very different 'comprehensive' views? (I am often reminded here of Burt Lancaster's character in the film Atlantic City: 'We only do business with people we do business with'.)

The general worry about reasonableness can be related to another criticism often made of liberal toleration, and which McKinnon never quite articulates explicitly, but which lies behind some of her discussion in Chapters 5-6. This argument says that liberal toleration is essentially hierarchical, and even works to produce, or at least reify, substantial inequalities between different individuals and groups. That is, even when 'difference' is tolerated, the various groups to which it refers exist in relations of domination, or at least in various forms of subjugation, relative to the dominant group(s). The idea, roughly speaking, is: 'we'll permit you to carry out your practice, or to keep believing the crazy things you do, but remember your place!' The principles are high-minded, but the practices of government less so, since it's clear that it is the dominant group(s) who decide where the line between the tolerable and intolerable is drawn. Toleration then is a kind of permission-concept, despite all the high-minded talk of restraint and equal consideration. Liberty itself -- in this case, say, the freedom to practice one's cultural or religious beliefs -- becomes a means through which various relations of power are exercised. The history of the emergence of toleration in the West, as well as the current social and political climate in Europe, North America and Australasia, suggests that there is something to this critique. (It's a shame McKinnon doesn't address these arguments head-on. Her main bugbear is Rorty, but in many ways, he is a much easier target than the argument I am summarizing here.)

McKinnon, however, is aware of at least some of these problems, and in Chapter 6 and then throughout the second half of her book, she works through related challenges facing her reasonableness defence. One key move she makes is to link the kind of harm that is going to be considered relevant for judgments about what is tolerable or intolerable to a particular language of rights. Taking up a problem sketched by Jeremy Waldron about the clash between a pornographer, a 'reasonable' Muslim and a secular humanist, McKinnon admits that simply imposing her conception of reasonableness on the Muslim objector will not work. So what kind of harm can the Muslim claim he has a right to be protected from? McKinnon argues that he will have to accept a political concept of harm, one oriented around the kinds of claims we discussed above with regard to Rawls's political liberalism. Continuing to insist on an 'internal' conception of harm is unreasonable, given the conditions of democratic societies in which the free exercise of reason generates 'reasonable pluralism'. The harm that does count, and the basis upon which one can claim that the state has a right to intervene, will have something to do with violation of people's rights. But, as she admits, this means that the reasonableness defence is now vulnerable to worries about the unduly narrow range of harms that individual rights pick out. And this might, as a result, severely disadvantage some people -- and some groups -- more than others, not necessarily because of the nature of their beliefs, but because of extant power relations not captured by the appeal to rights. Once again the worry is that liberal toleration is discreetly hierarchical: the appeal to the reasonable and to rights seems to load the dice in favour of a particularly narrow conception of harm or disadvantage.

In the end, McKinnon thinks that the reasonableness defence and the appeal to liberal rights can meet these objections and worries. Part of her argument is that we just have to work through the details of the cases to see whether reasonableness can, in fact, offer normative guidance as to the limits of toleration. What seems clear, though, is that the harms associated with the effects of pornography or hate speech, for example, are distributed unevenly in liberal societies. It's one thing to say, a la Mill, that putting up with racist hate speech is character-building, or that the illocutionary effects of pornography are too diffuse to warrant the ascription of a genuine harm. Bu it's another thing to be the actual person who is regularly the target of racist hate speech, or whose daily life is blighted by pornography. To her credit, although McKinnon ends up defending a standard liberal line -- banning headscarves and the Satanic Verses is unreasonable, and so too censoring pornography or criminalizing Holocaust Denial (although she tries, unsuccessfully in my view, to say that Holocaust deniers should be blocked from access to the Academy) -- she does so in an open way, and one that takes seriously the arguments of those defending the opposite positions. I found myself disagreeing with some of her conclusions, but she lays out the premises and alternative arguments in such a way that you never feel as though she is avoiding the difficult issues at stake. This makes the book an extremely useful text for undergraduate and graduate teaching. Students will find her rich discussions an excellent resource for developing their own views about the nature of toleration.

In the end, it's not clear to me that the neo-Kantian line McKinnon takes in defending toleration really does make it more stable or 'permanent' as she claims it can. At one point she says it doesn't really matter if it actually does, since we want arguments that tell us how people ought to behave as opposed to simply bending to the facts of moral psychology and contemporary realities (p. 76). This is one of the few false notes in the book. Toleration seems to me an unavoidably unstable concept, and one that no amount of principled re-description can fully secure. What we don't want is to over-moralize toleration. The aim should be to try to avoid the tendency towards stigmatisation and demonization that can arise out of declarations about the virtue of tolerance (as is occurring now with regard to Islamic minorities in the West). The more we claim toleration as a distinctly moral right linked uniquely to something like autonomy or reasonableness, the more likely we are to have to draw on controversial moral views that make toleration either impossible or redundant. There is no avoiding drawing on some kind of moral view; as we saw, toleration is a normatively dependent concept. But the danger is that we can end up setting the bar either too low or too high: either liberal toleration for liberals, or liberal toleration as occupying a higher ground relative to other moral and political outlooks, but without a clear sense of how it actually gets there. Another route, one that I think McKinnon dismisses too quickly, is to start with various practices of liberal toleration and work back to see what distinctive moral assumptions may be related to it. This means seeing toleration more as a distinctly political concept as opposed to moral virtue, albeit not 'merely' political but rather with complex roots in a range of different moral attitudes and beliefs. Some of these might indeed be more pragmatic than moral, such as the need for civic peace and to maintain some form of legitimate political order, but others will include the desire for cooperation, a particular view about the appropriate use of political power, the capacity to imagine how things might look from the perspective of a social minority, or indeed the acceptance of something like 'reasonable pluralism'. We should locate the justification of toleration at this level of a mixed concept -- between politics and morality, and prudence and moral virtue -- and pitch our appeal to what is reasonable in that space, as opposed to the neo-Kantian one.

[1] McKinnon focuses on the challenge of toleration within nation-states, as opposed to between them, or with regard to issues of global justice. There are interesting questions about the role of toleration in global politics, but she doesn't consider these and so I don't discuss them below.

[2] Rainer Forst, Toleranz im Konflict: Geschichte, Gehalt und Gegenwart eines umstrettenen Begriffs, Suhrkamp, 2003.

[3] There might also be epistemic arguments for toleration, which emphasize the contribution of toleration to knowledge. However, when deployed by writers like Mill, the value of knowledge is often tied very closely to moral claims, for example, because of its contribution to the morally valuable end of utility.