Toleration and Understanding in Locke

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Nicholas Jolley, Toleration and Understanding in Locke, Oxford University Press, 2016, 175pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198791706.

Reviewed by Victor Nuovo, Middlebury College and Harris Manchester College, Oxford


A principal purpose of Nicholas Jolley's book is to demonstrate the unity of Locke's thought, especially as expressed in his major works. The sort of unity he has in mind is thematic not systematic, for he acknowledges that these works arose under different occasions, were meant to address diverse problems, practical and theoretical, and so were not designed as expressions of a single intellectual project. However, they were written by a profound philosophical thinker who thought broadly and deeply about whatever concerned him, and who was disposed by his philosophical nature to base his judgements on principles that were far-reaching and fundamental. It seems reasonable, therefore, to suppose that these writings, however diverse, should express an underlying unity of thought and a unifying purpose. Locke was also a moralist with an acute awareness of the times in which he lived and the challenges they presented to living a virtuous life; hence, it is not surprising that the common theme Jolley identifies as running through these works and drawing them together is a practical one: toleration. Toleration, as Locke conceived it, is a public policy that obliges governments to grant individuals and groups within their domains liberty to practice and profess their religion as they see fit so long as by doing so they do not infringe upon the liberty of others, jeopardize the social welfare, or presume to exercise civil power. Jolley contends that this theme, although not this explicit policy, is the fundamental motive of Locke's thought.

This seems to be a very plausible hypothesis, but it is off target. Jolley has confused unity of thought with continuities within it, which may include abiding concerns. He has, I believe, clearly shown that toleration is a continuous thread running through Locke's major writings, but it is not the warp and woof of it that draws all parts together. Rather, it should be obvious that the great theme that unites the philosophical, religious, and political parts of Locke's thought is morality. After an exhaustive search into the sources and causes of knowledge and belief, Locke concluded the Essay by declaring that morality, not the science of nature, is the chief business of mankind; in the Epistola, he asserts that the 'business of true religion' is morality, 'the regulating of men's lives according to the rules of virtue and piety'. In the Second Treatise, Locke insists that the state of nature is not one of 'uncontrolable Liberty', that there is a rule of law, and that all men, as bearers of that law, are 'sent into the World' by divine order to do God's business. It is on this moral basis that a just and durable social contract is possible. It should be noted that this idea of man as a bearer of a divine law, who is obliged, even in a state of nature to care for the rest of mankind, is a type of Christ. The same theme informs The Reasonableness of Christianity. Morality is the great theme that unites Locke's thought and brings all the parts together in a coherent if not always consistent whole.

The book begins with an introductory chapter that ranges over the last four decades of Locke's life and provides historical context, focusing on key events that became occasions for Locke's reflections on toleration. The Exclusion Crisis (1679-81) occasioned by Protestant opposition to the Catholic James, Duke of York, as successor to Charles II occasioned Locke reflections on the origin and scope of political power. Its aftermath caused Locke to seek refuge in the Netherlands. While Locke was there, Louis XIV revoked the Edict of Nantes (1685), thereby terminating religious liberty to French Protestants. It was the impact of that event and his experience of a perhaps less cruel persecution of the Dutch Remonstrants that prompted Locke to think about toleration at the very time he was clarifying his position on the limits of knowledge and belief.

The remaining chapters are topical, each devoted to a concept or argument that Locke employed to define the nature and scope of toleration and defend its practice. Jolley's analyses and expositions are challenging and illuminating, even if one does not always agree with their outcomes. His concern is to show by these chapters that Locke bases his case for toleration on several arguments, and not on one only, as his nemesis, Jonas Proast contended.1 That argument turns on the claim that coercion is of no use whatever in establishing belief of any sort, and that any attempt to do so is futile and irrational. This is the argument that Jeremy Waldron has seized upon as the 'crux' of Locke's defense, along with Proast's qualified denial of it, which Waldron accepts, and which therefore leads him to characterize it as fatally flawed.2 The gist of Proast's denial is that even though belief cannot be coerced, coercion may be used as an effective means of situating an individual in circumstances that may conduce true belief, and therefore would be justified. Jolley's emphasis on this multipronged defense of toleration seems integral to a strategy of rescuing Locke's overall defense by relegating this argument to a less crucial role.

Chapters 3 and 4 advance this strategy. Chapter 3 builds upon the distinction between knowledge and belief, which is a central theme of An Essay concerning Human Understanding. Locke supposes that all knowledge is certain and incorrigible, whereas belief is not, and that the positive doctrines of any revealed religion cannot be known but only believed. This allowed Locke to avoid the following situation. If there were a true religion, which Locke was sure there was, and if its doctrines could be known by rational demonstration, then a magistrate who had such knowledge would be warranted to pursue a policy of intolerance towards infidels, for as rational beings, they should have known better. This is exactly the position that Locke took with regard to the first principles of natural religion -- that God exists and should be worshipped. But as Jolley points out, the distinction is incomplete. As Proast observed, Locke overlooks the possibility of belief that verges upon knowledge, which he terms 'full assurance' or the certainty of faith. This is a concept that Locke also had: assurance beyond doubt, belief bordering upon certainty; yet it is not knowledge.

Chapter 4 introduces the notion of cognitive individualism, and its analogue, doxastic individualism. The former reduces all knowledge to intuitive certainty; the latter reduces all belief to individual judgment, which, although it may depend upon testimony and persuasion by others, nonetheless is also autonomous. Chapter 5 is about the involuntary nature of knowledge and belief, which, when joined to the previous themes, provides a concise and complete view of Locke's rational defense of toleration, which is a notable achievement.  Chapter 6, the subject of which is enthusiasm, may be read as an appendix or supplement to the previous chapters. According to Jolley, Locke considered this mode of religious advocacy to be a specious mode of dogmatic individualism.

The remaining chapters play a critical role. Since Jolley's purpose is to demonstrate the unity of Locke's thought around the principle of toleration, he must address evidences in other writings that might defeat this purpose. Chapter 8 addresses the consistency of the Epistola and the Two Treatises. Jolley argues that although they diverge, they do so in ways that are mutually complementary; also, he observes that they converge on the principle of contractualism. In Chapter 8, Jolley is concerned that, in The Reasonableness of Christianity, Locke seems to deny one of the premises of his defense of toleration: that establishing the truth of a true religion requires expertise that the ordinary day-laborer does not possess. In this work, he advocates a doctrine, discoverable in Scripture, that even day-laborers may discover, and in this respect invokes the notorious notion of Locke's doctrinal minimalism, of which I will have more to say shortly. Chapter 10 explores the question of why Locke did not invoke natural law as a ground for the magistrate's duty to practice toleration, which, after all, he acknowledges is a natural right.

In a concluding chapter, Jolley provides a summary of his argument and concludes that he has cast new light not only on Locke's writings on toleration, but on meaning of the An Essay concerning Human Understanding, which, quoting John Rogers, he characterizes as a contribution to 'the epistemology of toleration', and asserts that it was this concern for toleration that drove Locke's endeavor to distinguish between knowledge and belief. As I have already commented, he is mistaken. It is too narrow a judgment. Morality, not toleration, is Locke's great theme, but it is morality conflated with the Christian religion and grounded in theism. In this respect, Jolley has also read Locke's Epistola too narrowly, literally, by ignoring its opening and concluding parts, and thematically, by not regarding it in the context of his Christian moralism. In his hortatory introduction, Locke reminds his readers that 'mutual toleration among Christians' is the 'chief distinguishing mark of the true church', but he immediately adds that 'the business of true religion' is 'regulating men's lives in accordance with virtue and piety', and hence that no one can be a Christian without charity or 'without faith which worketh, not by force, but by love', which is to put toleration is a much richer moral context, although a narrower one institutionally.

The concluding part, an appendix on the notions of heresy, schism and other related terms, is important because it gives insight on how Locke came upon his so-called minimalist definition of Christianity. Locke defines a religion as a society of believers who are governed by the same rule of faith, which he equates with sacred scripture of some sort. 'Turks' and 'Christians' are of different religions, because the one accepts the Koran, the other the Bible, as their rule of faith. But there are also multiple Christian religions, inasmuch as sects supplement the Bible with certain articles of faith that cannot be stated in the express words of Holy Scripture. A true Christian is one whose faith is expressed only in the words of the Bible, that is, the Christian Bible, whose ruling part is the New Testament. It is in this light that Locke's purpose in The Reasonableness of Christianity becomes clear. He set out to discover the 'faith that justifies' by attending to the gospel preaching of Jesus and his Apostles, and discovered, in clear biblical language, that one must accept that Jesus is the Messiah, a divine king and lawmaker, but also a savior. In the concluding section of that work, Locke, overcome perhaps by a sense of moral pessimism, concluded that acceptance of Jesus as Messiah was the only sure way of moral fulfillment. Accepting Jesus as the Messiah was an act of obedience that bound an individual not just to this one article, but to all the words of the Bible. So much for Locke's minimalism.

If it be asked, what made Locke so sure that there was a true religion, it is here that his grounding in theism comes into play. He supposed that the two doctrines that God exists and that God ought to be worshipped are rationally demonstrable, and from these may follow that there is a true religion, not merely a natural religion, but one consisting of positive doctrines revealed by God. This is an important question that, unfortunately, Jolley does not explore.

Locke's claim that atheists ought not be tolerated follows from all this. It raises the question whether there is anything living in Locke's theory of toleration. Jolley makes no mention of two other theories of toleration advocated by Locke's contemporaries, Pierre Bayle and Baruch Spinoza, both of which seem better suited to the circumstances of secular society; the former by separating morality from religious belief, the latter, by grounding it in the liberty to philosophize. It is unfortunate that Jolley did not write a longer book, comparing Locke's opinions with those of his eminent contemporaries.

1 Jonas Proast, The Argument of the Letter concerning Toleration, Briefly consider'd and Answer'd, (Oxford, 1690), 3-4.

2 Jeremy Waldron, 'Locke: Toleration and the Rationality of Persecution', in John Locke, A Letter Concerning Toleration, John Horton and Susan Mendus, eds. (Routledge, 1991), 116 and passim.