Toleration as Recognition

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Galeotti, Anna Elisabetta, Toleration as Recognition, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 242pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521806763.

Reviewed by Richard Dees, Saint Louis University


In Toleration as Recognition, Anna Elisabetta Galeotti offers a revision of the ideal of toleration that she hopes will deal effectively with the problems that face us in the twenty-first century without abandoning the core liberal ideals of equal respect and state neutrality. Traditionally, she argues, problems of toleration centered on issues of individual choices, but in today’s pluralistic societies, the difficult cases increasingly involve problems of identity for marginalized groups who lack respect from the broader society. The problem with all current liberal theories—whether they are a version of neutrality or a form of perfectionism—is that they have “a fundamental insensitivity to difference” (57). The members of oppressed groups are given individual rights, but they are not given the respect they need to be full participants in political life; they do not enjoy the “equal worth of liberty.” What is needed, she argues, is a symbolic recognition of their place in society “to reverse the previous invisibility, marginality, and stigmatization” (194): “The legitimation of their presence in public signifies their inclusion in the public sphere on the same footing as those whose practices and behavior are ‘normal’” (101). Such a position does not, she argues, require that others endorse the values of the group or even that they value differences as such; it only requires society to recognize the group because of its significance to the individuals who are a part of it.

Galeotti’s view is a significant contribution to a theory for a multicultural liberalism. She understands the ways in which the members of minority groups can be undermined by the majority culture both in overt actions and in more subtle misunderstandings, especially in the numerous ways white male Christian values are simply accepted as the norm by which everyone is judged. In addition, Galeotti adds a European perspective to a debate that is, ironically, often focused on North American problems. She nicely illustrates her view through the use of three extended case studies: the wearing of veils by Muslim schoolgirls in France, the existence of speech codes and hate-crimes legislation, and the debates surrounding the marriage of homosexuals. In a post-September 11 world, we might wonder about the relevance of the often-subtle forms of discrimination that are Galeotti’s chief focus. But, if anything, suspicion of those who fall outside the mainstream has been greatly amplified by the tragedy. So, just to take a random example, 82 percent of the readers of a reasonably well-known conservative journal, Insight on the News, could declare that practically speaking, there is no such thing as “moderate Islam” (Internet poll, September 24, 2002). The stakes have become higher for everyone, and so the vigilance that Galeotti advocates is needed more than ever. For these reasons alone, I find Galeotti’s view both interesting and important.

Nevertheless, I want to raise a few questions about her approach. First, I would like to raise a minor caveat about the way Galeotti frames the issues. She thinks debates about toleration have centered on issues of individual choices, but choice, I think, has rarely been the focus of toleration. In the twentieth century, issues of toleration focused on race and gender, neither of which can be seen as identities which are chosen, and in the classic literature, even religion was not seen as a matter of choice. One of Locke’s central arguments for toleration, recall, is that belief cannot be compelled because it is not a matter for the will. So the question of toleration has always been a question about how to accommodate different group identities. Nevertheless, Galeotti offers a new approach to toleration, even if its originality lies in its emphasis, rather than in a radical break with past theory.

Second and more importantly, her insistence on symbolic changes raises a few problems. Galeotti seeks a “public recognition of differences” for marginalized groups that is meant to undercut the feelings of impotence and inferiority that plague these groups: “Public toleration of differences is, however, pursued for its symbolic meaning: the official public acceptance of a different behavior or lifestyle, if properly grounded, signifies recognition of that difference” (100). By “symbolic,” Galeotti insists that she does not mean “meaningless,” “trivial,” or “unreal.” The symbolic recognition is supposed to lead to real changes in people’s lives (220-21). However, by suggesting that the changes are merely “symbolic,” Galeotti, I think, de-emphasizes the potentially dramatic changes she seeks. Since, by hypothesis, the public acceptance that is part of a citizen’s equal rights is not enough, the recognition that comes from being a citizen who happens to have another identity is not enough either. Equal respect for groups, she thinks, sometimes requires more than equal treatment. What marginalized groups need, then, is to be treated in ways that others are not treated, both to overcome their past and to expose the ways in which majority norms dominate public life.

Some might object that no group ever needs more than the recognition that is given to its individual members insofar as they are citizens. Such groups, they would argue, would only need special protection in one of two circumstances: if the group is harmed because the state illegitimately promotes values that lie outside those necessary for a liberal state (where what those values are will be thinner or thicker depending on whether the objector accepts neutralism or perfectionism), or if the group itself is promoting values that are at odds with those values. In the first case, the problem is not with the liberal theory, but with its execution, so no change in the theory is needed. In the second case, they would argue, the problem is with the group itself. If its values actively conflict with the requirements of a liberal society, then they cannot be expected to be tolerated, much less recognized.

To respond to this dilemma, Galeotti must make two claims. First, she must show that even if a liberal state does not promote values beyond the minimum, these groups will still be marginalized and stigmatized. But for this argument to be decisive, she must also show that the state is not passively promoting values: a state that simply allows racism to affect people’s chances to advance themselves is not promoting even a minimal form of equality that every liberal theory recognizes. Galeotti is able to support an argument for the first point very well, and her claim does begin to address the second, even if she has not gone far enough to prove what is undoubtedly a difficult point to prove. Nevertheless, I am willing to grant her this point for the sake of argument: she could, after all, simply claim that her theory is meant to force the agents of the state to think more actively about the goals they passively promote, and even if we do not think a change in liberal theory is needed to accommodate her point, the new emphasis on these issues may lead us to accept Galeotti’s view.

However, to respond to the second half of the dilemma, Galeotti must also show not only that the groups themselves pose no threat to the liberal society, but also that their values are in harmony with that society. Some groups, we might argue, like a pacifist version of the Ku Klux Klan or the Nation of Islam, should be tolerated because they do not pose a direct threat to people, but because the values of the groups are at odds with the basic tenets of a liberal society, we should do nothing to recognize them as a group. The individuals in them deserve nothing more than the individual rights that they have as citizens to freedom of thought, speech, and religion, and to assemble peaceably. To deserve recognition, then, a group must promote values that do not conflict with those in the society at large. If so, then Galeotti’s claim that recognition does not require society to endorse the values of a marginalized group rings hollow. While the members of a society do not need to see the group as a positive addition to the society, they do have to see that the group can work within the norms of the society. Although others do not have to endorse everything about the group, they do have to endorse its values, at least for political purposes. That endorsement is fairly minimal, but it goes beyond what mere toleration requires.

In her defense, Galeotti often notes that many marginalized groups are stigmatized even when their values are consonant with those of liberal society in general. So the problem is really that majority groups should be more willing than they are to endorse the political values of marginalized groups. Insofar as this problem is significant, Galeotti’s “toleration as recognition” is an important positive program.

Nevertheless, Galeotti often glides past the important issues that are usually the key to the debate about whether a particular group deserves recognition. Opponents often suggest that some groups deserve to be marginalized because they promote values that do in fact harm the society at large. The extent to which, for example, homosexuals should be tolerated turns precisely on the question of whether their full acceptance in society would undermine the family. To argue successfully for the full inclusion of gays and lesbians in society, we must argue that they pose no such threat. Such a debate cannot take place at a high level of abstraction; the outcome of such a debate does and should depend on the particular qualities of the group in question. What Galeotti’s account needs is a straightforward discussion of how we can assess the kinds of threats a group—be it minority or majority—might pose to a liberal state and society.