Toleration in Conflict: Past and Present

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Rainer Forst, Toleration in Conflict: Past and Present, Ciaran Croni (tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2013, 635pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521885775.

Reviewed by John Horton, Keele University


Rainer Forst is one of the outstanding political philosophers of his generation, and Toleration in Conflict is simply the most impressive philosophical work specifically on toleration that I have ever read (and over the years I have read rather a lot of such books). It is an immensely long and thorough work, and it is hard to resist a smile when reading in the Preface that it is actually an abridged version of the German edition, originally over 800 pages, although Forst generously reassures us that the English-language edition 'contains everything essential' (p. xiii). One reason for this length is that it is almost two books in one. (Given the cost, though, I resist any tendency to write "two books for the price of one".) About three quarters of the text consists of a history of toleration in Western thought (and to some extent practice) from antiquity to the twentieth century, while in the last quarter of the book Forst develops his own theory of toleration. There is also a forty-four page bibliography and an exemplary index. The original German edition was published ten years ago, and (entirely reasonably) there has been no attempt to update it, so more recent work has not therefore been addressed; for example, Wendy Brown's tirade against toleration. The translator, Ciaran Cronin, has worked closely with Forst, whose own English is in my experience exemplary, and the result is an English-language text that reads both fluently and idiomatically, the very occasional 'Germanicism' aside.

Although I have described it as almost two books in one, it would be misleading if this gave the impression of any disconnect between the parts. While each probably could just about be read independently of the other, a good deal would be lost in so doing. The historical story is informed by the theory of toleration of the second part, which is in turn largely reconstructed from the historical analysis of the first part. Thus the book opens with a discussion of the concept of toleration and various ideas (conceptions) of how that concept can be interpreted, including a consideration of the so-called 'paradoxes' of toleration. The structure of the concept as Forst sets it out is clear and compelling, and is likely to elicit only minor disagreements at most. However, considerably more distinctive and original is his identification of four principal conceptions of toleration: the permission conception, the coexistence conception, the respect conception (which admits of two forms -- formal equality and qualitative equality) and the esteem conception.

The permission conception, which for much of the history of the theory and practice of toleration has been its dominant form and probably remains the most common understanding of it,

designates the relation between an authority or a majority and a minority (or several minorities) which does not subscribe to the dominant system of values. Toleration here means that the authority (or majority) grants the minority the permission to live in accordance with its convictions so long as it -- and this is the crucial condition -- does not question the predominance of the authority (or majority). (p. 27)

The coexistence conception can be understood as an adaptation of the permission conception in circumstances where there is no longer a single dominant group but, instead, 'groups of approximately equal strengths who recognise that they must practise tolerance for the sake of social peace and in their own interests' (p. 28). On this conception the 'toleration relation is thus no longer a vertical one, as in the permission conception, but a horizontal one: those who exercise tolerance are at the same time also tolerated' (pp. 28-9). (Generally, the distinction between horizontal and vertical forms of toleration, roughly those exercised by dominant powers and by fellow citizens, respectively, has an important role in Forst's analysis.) However, what is fundamental is that neither the permission nor the coexistence conceptions 'lead to a form of mutual recognition which goes beyond the sufferance of others and rests on farther-reaching moral or ethical considerations' (p. 29).

The respect conception of toleration, by contrast, does just that: it 'proceeds from a morally grounded form of mutual respect on the part of the individuals or groups who exercise toleration. The tolerating parties respect one another as autonomous persons or as equally entitled members of a political community constituted under the rule of law' (p. 29). Ultimately, the respect conception is grounded in an acceptance of 'the right to justification', which requires collective norms to be reciprocally and generally valid. As this is the conception of toleration to which Forst wishes to give primacy, I shall have more to say about it later. However, it is worth remarking here that it can take one of two forms: formal equality or qualitative equality. 'The former assumes a strict separation between the private and public domains according to which ethical differences between citizens should be confined to the private domain and must not lead to conflicts within the public political sphere' (p. 30). Qualitative equality, on the other hand, is more accommodating of the public political expression of ethical and cultural identities, and 'implies recognising the claim of others to full membership in the political community without demanding that in the process they must renounce their ethical-cultural identity in ways that cannot be reciprocally required' (p. 31). The final conception of toleration, the esteem conception,

involves a more demanding form of mutual recognition than the respect conception, for, according to it, toleration means not only respecting the members of other cultural or religious communities as legal and political equals but also esteeming their convictions and practices as ethically valuable. (p.31)

Forst has little to say about this conception, which he associates principally with value-pluralism, but intimates that he thinks it is too demanding.

These four conceptions, and especially the permission and respect conceptions, are key to understanding the emergence of a complex discourse about toleration, although there is no straightforward narrative of development, and earlier conceptions of toleration are not simply displaced by succeeding ones; rather they coexist, often in uneasy tension with one another. The first part, therefore, is not a conventional history of the theory and practice of toleration, but what Forst describes as 'a critical history of argumentation' about toleration, linking 'the systematic analysis of the justifications of toleration with a genealogical analysis of the practices of toleration (as practices of power)' (p. 13). Essentially, this means elucidating arguments about toleration in their political and ideological context, with the intention of making 'the complexity of the concept of toleration so clear that some of our deeply ingrained judgements (and prejudices) concerning it are shaken' (p. 14). Argumentation is crucial, moreover, because toleration is a 'normatively dependent concept' in that without some foundation in higher-order normative principles, the concept is necessarily indeterminate between the different conceptions: 'it cannot itself answer the question concerning the best conception, since each of these conceptions can justifiably claim to be an interpretation of the concept' (p. 32). Such a process of assessment and evaluation requires a philosophical analysis of the merits of the various arguments, which is what Forst offers us.

There is a wealth of interesting (and perhaps just occasionally less interesting) detail in Forst's rich and mostly sensitive reconstruction of the story of toleration in Western history. (He explicitly excludes cultures and traditions that have not contributed to this 'Western' discourse.) Many figures previously neglected in the context of toleration make an appearance, especially from the pre-modern period -- Ramon Llull for one was entirely new to me -- and although I am not myself competent in many cases to assess what Forst has to say about them, on the basis of those about whom I do know something, I have no reason to doubt that he is a reliable guide. Moreover, more generally, he makes a decent case for rejecting 'the widespread notion that toleration is a child of modernity, whereas antiquity and the Middle Ages represent nothing more than a prehistory of minor importance' (p. 93).

Perhaps the principal point of the historical story, however, is to unsettle and displace a common Anglo-centric account in which Locke is the dominant figure (and -- grossly over-simplifying -- runs Milton, Locke, J. S. Mill and Rawls) with a revisionist account in which the true hero of toleration is the French philosopher, Pierre Bayle (although an important forerunner is the little known, Sebastian Castellio). In Forst's view, it is Bayle who makes the crucial move that enables the emergence of the respect conception of toleration that Forst himself champions. It is Bayle who connects

the normative thesis involved in the non-religious principle that actions which affect the freedom of others are in need of reciprocal justification with the epistemological thesis of the finitude of reason in religious questions, which are thus matters of reasonable disagreements. It is these two components of practical and theoretical reason which ground the central insight into the non-justifiability of religious coercion, and hence the duty of toleration (p. 264).

Locke, by contrast, only moved beyond the more limited permission conception of toleration, reluctantly and hesitantly, in his later Letters, when under pressure from his indefatigable interrogator, Jonas Proast; a change which meant that he had to 'abandon the main argument of his first Letter' (p. 231).

Furthermore, unlike J. S. Mill for example, Bayle's argument is free of any of the perfectionist strands that ground autonomy-based liberal justifications of toleration. Instead, the appropriate conception of autonomy for grounding toleration, and the most important development for theorising toleration subsequent to Bayle, is to be found in Kant's idea 'that other persons must be respected unconditionally as moral persons' (p. 317). And it is Kant who is

the first to develop a rational conception of morality which makes such a clear separation between norms and principles, which achieve categorical moral validity in virtue of being strictly justifiable and universalisable, and those systems of values or doctrines of happiness which do not and hence are unsuited to defining a universally binding morality (p. 317).

It is, according to Forst, the crucial role of 'Castellio, and especially Bayle and (in part) Kant' that 'is the decisive finding of the critical history of argumentation' (p. 401).

There is little doubt in my mind that Forst is largely successful in his challenge to the Anglo-centric story of toleration as it is sometimes presented, although at times he perhaps reads too much of his own view into Bayle and underestimates the radical potential in some of Locke's arguments in the original Letter, even if Locke himself either did not always see it or chose, possibly for political reasons, not to stress it. The picture is certainly shown to be more complex than many philosophers (if not historians) have portrayed it, and at least until some convincing counter-arguments are set forth, I am persuaded that Bayle's importance for the development of the idea of toleration has been under-appreciated, although of course it would be mistaken to imply that he has been ignored, even by Anglo-centric philosophers.

The upshot of the historical section is the identification of a number of routes to a variety of conceptions of toleration. However, Forst is far from content to let matters rest there. Rather, he wants to defend one particular conception, the respect conception (in its qualitative form), as superior to all others on the basis that it alone is grounded in the principle of justification itself. 'No other values or norms except the principle of justification itself', he writes,

can provide the foundation of the higher-level, generally justified and itself tolerant theory of toleration. This meta-principle, which . . . determines the normative grammar of the dynamic of toleration by exposing all justifications of intolerance or tolerance to a reciprocal and general duty to provide adequate reasons, as a substantive normative principle will ultimately provide the basis for toleration and thus trump the alternative approaches (p. 400).

The principal purpose of second part of the book is to defend this claim and to apply the theory to a number of current controversies about toleration.

The foundations of the right to justification are only sketched in Toleration in Conflict, as Forst has provided a much more extensive defence and elaboration of this idea in his The Right to Justification: Elements of a Constructivist Theory of Justice (Columbia University Press, 2012). The key claim of relevance here is that, where fundamental values are at stake, only principles or norms that 'cannot be reciprocally and generally rejected' can be legitimately imposed on those subject to them. This involves what Forst calls 'relativisation without relativism' or, as one might alternatively put it, toleration without scepticism. Thus,

in contexts of justification in which universal obligations are at stake, toleration requires that one refrain from imposing one's own ethical convictions without appropriate justification precisely when one continues to believe that these convictions are true and right. Even if these evaluative convictions do not overcome the threshold of reciprocity and generality with the required reasons, it by no means follows that they can no longer be regarded as true or right and that they are ethically devalued, but only that they do not provide a sufficient reason, at least in this situation, for general normative regulation. This is the crucial insight of toleration (p. 455).

Thus, 'the limits of toleration are reached when others are denied their basic right to justification in general, or, alternatively, this right is flouted in particular cases' (p. 455).

This normative foundation for toleration, however, needs to be supplemented by an epistemological argument if it is to even hope to resolve any particular disputes about the limits of toleration. For, without support from such an epistemological component, the right to justification leaves entirely open what reasons are genuinely reciprocal and general. For instance, I could simply claim that it is unreasonable of anyone to reject my religious beliefs, which I assert to be clearly and indisputably true, an attitude which, far from being extreme, is the form of argument against toleration that has been prevalent throughout most of human history. The role of what Forst calls 'the finitude of reason' is to set some limits as to what can count as such reasons. In short, largely following Habermas, we have to distinguish the moral from the ethical spheres, where the former is precisely defined by its ability to supply reciprocal and general reasons, while the latter is necessarily open to reasonable disagreement. And, because ethical beliefs are matters of reasonable disagreement, people can also reasonably reject norms being imposed on them that rest on such contentious foundations, at least where their own fundamental values or status as free and equal citizens is at stake. In the closing chapter Forst then goes on to show how, armed with the respect conception of toleration underpinned by the right to justification and the finitude of reason, many contemporary disputes about toleration, such as those to do with the so-called 'crucifix case' in Germany, head-scarves, Wisconsin versus Yoder and same-sex marriages, can be successfully resolved, although he accepts that there are a few controversies, principally that about abortion, which cannot be resolved in this way. However, along with much else of interest, including an acute and subtle critique of Rawls's position, particularly the role of overlapping consensus, and a discussion of how his own view differs from Rawls's, it is not possible to explore these here.

How convinced one is by Forst's case is likely to depend, at least to some degree, on how far one buys into the sharp separation of the moral and the ethical and whether one believes that the right to justification really can do the work he claims. In fairness, it should be noted that Forst does allow that there will be difficult cases, grey areas and that arguments will need to be sensitive to context. But, even granting this, he seems to me over-optimistic in holding that there is a viable and reasonably clear distinction between the moral and the ethical and that the right to justification has the cutting edge needed to resolve many practical controversies about toleration. I also wonder whether he, like many others who employ the reasonable rejection test in one form or another, is not unduly sanguine about the possibility that there might turn out to be very much that we can justify imposing on others if we take this test seriously. And for these reasons, among others, I think that Forst, too, undervalues the increasingly derided permission and coexistence conceptions of toleration. For, if the scope for disagreement in the application of the right to justification is much more extensive than he supposes, and the finitude of reason applies equally to many cherished ideas about justice and the moral (and not only supposedly ethical beliefs or practices), then there is also a place for the permission and coexistence conceptions of toleration as something more than merely a second best (which is pretty much how Forst views them).

Although Forst will likely see this as a remnant of my attachment to these limited and inferior conceptions of toleration, I also think that making the boundaries of justice and toleration coincide in the way that he does paradoxically undermines the need for any distinctive idea of toleration. For, on his account, we are either under a strict duty of justice to tolerate something, if its prohibition cannot be reciprocally and generally justified, or under a similar duty not to tolerate it, if its prohibition can be so justified. In this way toleration as a distinct value is in danger of becoming redundant in that it can seemingly be replaced without significant loss by the requirements of justice: both tolerance and intolerance are mandated by justice, without there being any scope for things of which we can be legitimately intolerant but that are not obviously unjust (such as various ways of preying on the weak or disadvantaged) or, more controversially no doubt, things that although unjust it might be right on principled grounds to tolerate (such as racist speech). There seems to be little space (limited only to what are by definition non-fundamental questions) within his account for a government ever legitimately to have a view, more specifically to disapprove, of some practice or behaviour, and also tolerate it legally (on anything other than narrowly prudential grounds).

Although, as is evident, I have not been entirely won over to Forst's defence of the respect conception of toleration, there can surely be no denying that his arguments are often extremely powerful and his overall vision highly civilized and, in many respects, deeply attractive: the kind of tolerant society he describes is one that I (although by no means everyone) would be very happy to inhabit. And he has certainly written a book that nobody interested in the theory of toleration can properly ignore. I have no doubt that his voice will be a dominant one in shaping the continuing philosophical debates about the meaning and justification of toleration.