Tolle Lege: Essays on Augustine and on Medieval Philosophy in Honor of Roland J. Teske, SJ

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Richard C. Taylor, David Twetten, and Michael Wreen (eds.), Tolle Lege: Essays on Augustine and on Medieval Philosophy in Honor of Roland J. Teske, SJ, Marquette University Press, 2011, 364pp., $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780874628074.

Reviewed by Joseph Wawrykow, University of Notre Dame


This volume honors a scholar who retired in 2008 as the first holder of the Schuenke Chair of Philosophy at Marquette University. Teske has published a great deal over the years, and his work has taken different forms: articles (some of which have been collected in book form), translations, reviews (including a few that have appeared in this journal). The greater part of Teske's work has been devoted to three main figures: the thirteenth-century scholastics William of Auvergne and Henry of Ghent, and the great early theologian Bishop Augustine of Hippo. Respected for his investigations into a considerable range of philosophical and even theological topics, Teske is also a prolific translator of all three; one of the contributors to the volume (Joseph Lienhard, p. 153) offers the claim that Teske has translated more of Augustine into English than anyone else, a claim that has the air of plausibility (although the translating of Edmund Hill and Maria Boulding has also been extensive).

The volume in the main echoes Teske's scholarly interests. As indicated by the subtitle, it is divided into two main parts, with nine essays on Augustine in the first, five in the second part, on medieval philosophy, including one on William of Auvergne. (There is, alas, no article on Henry of Ghent.) Many of the entries in the second part do deal with issues that are plainly philosophical. There are essays on: medieval analyses of motion, in the wake of Aristotle (John Doyle); the Augustinian understanding of language as this influenced medieval developments (Philipp Rosemann); the hierarchy of being according to Galileo and some contemporaries (Edward Mahoney); and William of Auvergne's understanding of human being (John Laumakis). William Harmless's essay, on Bernard of Clairvaux as 'experienced exegete' -- that is, on how Bernard's reading of scripture shapes and nourishes his spirituality -- would seem to be 'philosophy' only in a broader sense that includes theology and religious practice.

The essays in the first part address significant issues in the Augustinian corpus; the Latin of the book's title, recalling the famous garden scene in Confessions 8, underscores Augustine's importance to Teske. Two essays look at Augustine's dealings with the Pelagians (Gerald Bonner and Dorothea Weber). Another is on his views and practice of theology as setting the stage for later theological practice (Frederick Van Fleteren). Others look at aspects of Augustinian teaching on the Trinity (Lienhard) and salvation through Christ (David Vincent Meconi; for more on both of these essays, see below). Remaining essays in this part consider Augustine as a reader of Cicero (Charles Brittain); the importance of matter for Augustine's teaching about friendship and happiness in the Confessions (Ann Pang-White); how Augustine's notion of memory can inform a reading of The Tempest (Joseph Koterski); and how reflecting on the soliloquy in the early work can help in apprehending Augustine's progress in understanding the self in relation to God (James Wetzel).

Most, although not all, of the contributors make at least a brief effort to relate their own contribution to Teske's scholarly work. They do this by employing one of Teske's translations in an article, or by quoting and making one's own what is taken as an apt characterization employed by Teske, or by asserting some signal contribution to scholarship that Teske has made. Perhaps the most intriguing engagement with Teske, and certainly the most extended, is that by Laumakis in his article on William of Auvergne. Laumakis mentions that he had first made the acquaintance of William in a seminar taught by Teske. In his contribution, Laumakis observes that Teske had argued in an article of his own that William has a spiritualist view of the human. And there are without doubt passages in William that seem to identify the human solely with soul. But, as Laumakis shows, there are other passages in which the importance of body for construing the human is also evident. William comes close, in Laumakis's judgment, to what Aquinas would later assert, affirming the human as a body-soul composite. The debt of the student to the teacher is evident, as is the underlying generosity of the teacher. The work of the teacher has been the springboard for his own.

As seems inevitable in any collection with contributions by several authors, the volume is uneven in quality. A handful of essays stand in need of deepening. Koterski reads The Tempest in the light of Augustine on memory (a topic of importance to Teske). However, he allows that he doesn't know if Shakespeare was in fact familiar with Augustine on memory (pp. 116, 123). It would have been worthwhile researching what notions of memory were current at the time and available to Shakespeare, and determining to what extent any of these were informed by Augustine. A few essays -- e.g., that by Doyle -- are in the end content with a recounting of positions on a given topic, without further analysis or reflection on the upshot of these positions. Doyle acknowledges this (p. 273), at the end of his review of an example adduced by numerous thinkers in connection with the Aristotelian requirement, in the account of motion, of a unitary subject of change. What about the case of the falling dog, who halfway through the descent, dies? In that case, is there the unitary subject required in Aristotelian theory? Thinkers, from Burley through to John of St. Thomas, had different responses to the apparent problem case. Some adverted in this connection to the dispute over the number of substantial forms (see, e.g., p. 259, n. 18). If there is more than one substantial form in a being, then there is no problem -- despite the dog's death, there is a single subject, provided by the remaining form(s). That observation could have opened the door, I would think, to showing what else was at stake in reflecting more carefully about motion, unity, and agency, leading to a consideration of important theological issues, having to do with Christ and the Eucharist. Aquinas in his lifetime, and after, was hammered Christologically for his assertion of a single substantial form: if only one, then that really isn't 'Christ' in the tomb. And what, if any, was the impact of the Oxford and Parisian condemnations of the 1270s on meditations on motion? To the good, such essays (see Mahoney's as well) by their reporting do make available texts that would otherwise remain obscure.

Several of the essays are quite impressive. Lienhard offers a level-headed, accurate account of Augustine's affirmation of the filioque, that is, that the Holy Spirit proceeds from the Son as well as the Father. That teaching is rooted in Augustine's meditations on scripture, with its proclamation that the Spirit is the Spirit of both the Father and Christ. Meconi offers a nuanced description of Augustine on deification in Christ: through Christ, the second divine person becomes human, other humans can be raised into the triune God's own life, coming to share in that by the grace offered in Christ. Such essays in effect offer effective responses to criticisms commonly made of Augustine: that his Trinitarian teaching, not least on the filioque, is overly speculative and not sufficiently anchored in scripture; that he overplays sin and hence fixates solely on the remedial quality of grace, to the exclusion of its elevating capacity. Read in conjunction, other essays address a third common misapprehension of Augustine, that he distrusts body and himself proffers an overtly spiritualist interpretation of the human, where it is the soul and its aspirations that allegedly predominate. In Pang-White's "Friendship and Happiness: Why Matter Matters in Augustine's Confessions," and in Wetzel's meditations on the progress between the early Soliloquies and the Confessions, it becomes clearer that Augustine could advance a positive assessment of body and viewed the human as a soul-body composite in his description of human flourishing in relation to God.

The editors, members of the faculty of Philosophy at Marquette, have produced a fitting tribute to their former colleague. The editors did not contribute essays of their own to the volume, leaving that to those whom they had enlisted in the project. They have, however, done a commendable job in preparing the volume for publication, aided by the two assistants named in the note on p. 15. The Introduction nicely highlights crucial features of Teske's research, including his commitment to making accessible, through his informed translations, important writings, early and medieval. The text is mostly free of typos; in a few of the entries, however, a word here or there seems missing, detracting from the sense (see, e.g., the editors' Introduction, as in the first two lines of the final paragraph, p. 15). They have provided a useful summary of Abbreviations to the main Augustinian works to which the essays refer, and a list of Teske's publications (up to April 2011), as well as Indices of Names and Subjects. The volume would have been enhanced, however, by a List of Contributors, indicating institutional affiliation and the nature of the connection to Teske, although in some cases the latter can be discerned from the publications list or by comments by a given author (as is the case, e.g., for Lienhard, p. 153, and Laumakis, noted above).