Torture and the Ticking Bomb

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Bob Brecher, Torture and the Ticking Bomb, Blackwell Publishing, 2007, 122pp., $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405162029.

Reviewed by C.A.J. Coady, University of Melbourne


One of the most disedifying sights on the public scene in the early years of the 21st century has been the spectacle of serious intellectuals rushing to justify torture. This is especially disturbing in a context in which governments persistently employ torture, albeit mostly with euphemism and secrecy, in the "war on terror".

Adding insult to injury has been the fact that the debate, especially in the United States, has proceeded as if the question is whether the desperate times require "us" now to turn to torture when in fact torture has been a part of the foreign policy of democratic governments for decades. From the French in Algeria, the British in Northern Ireland, and the Israelis in Palestine to the United States in Vietnam and Iraq (not to mention American training and support for torturers in South America), the catalogue of torture by righteous democracies predates the war on terror, though more recent events have spurred the practice as Abu Ghraib, Guantanamo Bay, and "extraordinary rendition" have made clear.

Bob Brecher has accepted the challenge of the defenders of torture in this excellent book. He is primarily concerned with the so-called "ticking bomb" argument, probably the primary staple in the diet of examples deployed by the torture supporters. The bare bones of the scenario are familiar: a terrorist has planted bombs in a number of places but has been captured and the question is whether he or she should be tortured for crucial information that would save those who are likely to be killed by the bombs. As long ago as 1973, in his influential article, "Political Action: The Problem of Dirty Hands", Michael Walzer asked us to consider with sympathy the plight of a political leader "asked to authorize the torture of a captured rebel leader who knows or probably knows the location of a number of bombs hidden in apartment buildings around the city, set to go off within the next twenty-four hours." This sort of example, for all its scary aspects, is as Brecher shows, radically underdescribed, and when fleshed out it has an other-worldly quality that rightly qualifies it for Henry Shue's recent characterisation: "torture in dreamland."

Brecher believes that an absolute prohibition of torture as profoundly wrong can be defended on moral grounds concerned with the nature of the act itself, but he does not try to support that position here, preferring to limit his argument in two respects. The first is a restriction of the topic to interrogational torture and the second is a methodological restriction to argue for a complete rejection of torture with utilitarian reasons alone. This is an attempt to meet the opposition on its own ground since he claims that "All those who advocate interrogational torture, whether legalized or not, simply assume some variety of a utilitarian understanding of morality: if the benefit of the action outweighs its disbenefits, then that action is morally justified." (p. 12) The restriction on topic is similarly grounded since most theorists who advocate torture are concerned to justify interrogational torture and not torture for revenge, political intimidation or punishment. In fact, Brecher believes that his arguments could be adapted to cover the wider scope, but his success would constitute a major achievement even with these restrictions.

Brecher's criticism of the ticking bomb story challenges its reality on several fronts. He objects to its extravagant epistemological assumptions, to its lack of attention to the institutional realities required to underpin the example, to the inadequacy of the (very few) empirical citations used to back up the story, to the sloppy calculations of utility that the example invokes. A particular sub-target of his critique is the proposal by the Harvard lawyer, Allan Dershowitz, that the practice of torture should be legalised but controlled by the issuing of torture warrants.

On the epistemology of torture scenarios, Brecher argues that built into such scenarios is information that is extremely unlikely to be available to the prospective torturers or their masters in the real world. They are supposed to "know" (or be reasonably confident) that a bomb has been planted, though they don't know where, that it is going to explode very shortly (so there is no time for any remedy but torture), that the prisoner has the information about the bomb's whereabouts, that the prisoner is likely to yield the information under torture, and that the torture can be delivered in such a way that, in the time available, the prisoner will not die or become incapable of communicating under torture. In the real world of intelligence fallibility (think Iraqi weapons of mass destruction), false imprisonment (think Guantanamo Bay) and sometimes fanatically dedicated terrorists, it is hardly within the realms of likelihood that these conditions will be fulfilled together. Indeed, it may be rather more likely that either there is no bomb, or the captive is not a terrorist, or not the one who knows the whereabouts of the bomb, or he/she is too tough to yield to torture, or can hold out long enough for the bomb to explode, or can deliberately give information that sends you on a wild goose chase so that the bomb explodes, or is innocent but still gives you false information in order to stop the torture and so the wild goose chase is again the upshot, or the prisoner dies or is rendered incapable too soon. Or some compatible combination of several of the above.

On the institutional background, Brecher argues that, even supposing most of the knowledge conditions to be fulfilled, the sort of torture that is likely to succeed in extracting the information on a reliable basis would require trained torturers rather than amateur thugs, so that the levels of pain could be sufficient to procure the victim's compliance but insufficient to kill or render incapable of communication. Hence we face not merely the one-off scenarios beloved of philosophers, but the prospect of institutionalising torture, a prospect that a civilised society should view with horror. It is of course possible that brutal, untrained thugs will succeed in beating some truth out of some suspect, but if we are talking about a policy of torture for the extreme cases, we need to think more systematically than the one-off scenario supposes. For the ticking bomb cases, we need trained technicians of agonising pain, rather than hairy-chested thugs.

Both the institutional and the epistemological points are also relevant to Brecher's claim that the utility of "ticking bomb" torture is conceived too simplistically by its advocates. He argues this in several ways. One is that in addition to sloppy assumptions of knowledge, there is a casual dismissal of realistic, relevant alternatives built into the example. Consider Jean Bethke Elshtain's version in which it is known that a deadly bomb has been planted in one of the city's elementary schools and will explode in an hour's time. You have the usual certainties about the prisoner and so on. Why, asks Brecher, would you "waste time torturing the suspect … instead of getting on the phone to evacuate everyone from all the schools"? (p. 17) Of course, Elshtain has this covered with the usual philosophical aplomb since she simply asserts that "officials know they cannot evacuate all the schools". No doubt the fiendish terrorists have already somehow destroyed the telephone system and the computer networks. But if they are that efficient and powerful, they have also doubtless made the torture futile by planting a suspect who has false information about the bomb's whereabouts.

Another defect of the pro-torture theorists is a failure of consistency in the application of their basic ethical methodology. Most theorists supporting torture restrict their endorsements to the cases where the victim is suspected of having planted the ticking bomb or being an accomplice. Sometimes, like Dershowitz, they explicitly disavow any support for "third-party" torture. But this is surely puzzling since the grounds on which the torture of suspects is allowed seem clearly to allow also for the torture of innocents where it is likely to be effective and the stakes are high enough. If the captured terrorist is too tough to succumb to brutality, then why not torture his child or mother in front of him to extract the vital information? Utilitarians have no truck with any absolute prohibitions, and see no intrinsic wrong in harming the innocent -- it all depends on the likely outcomes. Brecher raises this issue in his discussion of Dershowitz's legalisation proposal and in his discussion of the evils of a "torturous society", but it is a quite general problem for the advocates of torture, and it exposes a hidden strain of thought in the pro-torture case, namely, the idea that torturing the (putatively) guilty is, or can be, inherently legitimate. This is a throw-back to a centuries-old attitude to the legitimacy of torture as either punishment or interrogation: the guilty have lost their rights to many things, including freedom from the infliction of severe pain. St. Augustine's principal anxiety about interrogational torture of suspects (which he reluctantly endorsed) was that the torturers might mistakenly be torturing an innocent person.

Brecher does not probe this background, but he does point to the problem that the pro-torture faction has in excluding third-party torture from its permissive net. Dershowitz faces the problem and tries to argue that a resort to rule-utilitarianism "or other principles of morality" will do the trick. Brecher replies, in effect, that if rule-utilitarianism can allow the torture of the suspects, then it is impossible that it can rule out absolutely the torture of innocents, and Dershowitz's resort to "other principles of morality" is out of place within a basically utilitarian outlook (such as his). The question of torturing third parties can hardly be set aside as irrelevant since, monstrous as it is, the tactic has been used by torturers including those in one of the cases Dershowitz cites as proving the effectiveness of torture where the terrorist Abu Nidal was broken by Jordanian torturers who threatened to torture his mother. The question is whether, in an extreme enough emergency, the ticking bomb confraternity has anything to say against the tactic.

The methodology of the pro-torture theorists is also subject to further expansionist problems that Brecher exploits effectively. If, for instance, it is legitimate to torture a "known" terrorist for a "known" imminent ticking bomb, why not a merely suspected terrorist or a possibly knowledgeable acquaintance for a dreadful crime that might be committed in the future? Why not preventive torture of "rogue" individuals who might lay ticking bombs in the future? After all, this would eliminate the time constraints that make torture in the standard ticking bomb scenario so potentially unreliable.

Brecher spends a good deal of space unravelling the complexities and confusions of Dershowitz's proposal for torture warrants. Dershowitz claims that he is not arguing for the morality of torture which he opposes unconditionally, but Brecher shows why so many have interpreted him as morally condoning torture in extreme cases. Dershowitz's grasp of philosophical issues in ethics is quite uncertain, and he often appears to be a rule-utilitarian, but it is probably best to construe his position as a version of dirty hands. In any case, whatever the ambiguities in Dershowitz's own discussion, the advocacy of torture warrants is formally consistent with the total moral rejection of torture, since the complex relation of morality to enacted law surely allows that something could be considered immoral but not rendered totally illegal. This is the attitude of many to prostitution: since sex-for-money will occur whatever the law's prohibitions, and the prohibitions bring evils of police corruption, etc. with them, then it is better to have a legal regime of limited permission and control for the wrong-doing.

But a great deal turns on whether some form of legalisation does indeed prevent more evils than it allows. Here, Dershowitz makes three claims for his proposal that torture be permitted only if a torture warrant is obtained from a judge. The first is that institutionalising torture in this way will produce less torture, the second is that it would reduce the possibility of politicians, police, etc. appealing to "necessity" to justify torture, and the third is that it would eliminate the hypocritical stance of practicing torture while denying it. Brecher shows that Dershowitz produces no serious evidence for the first of these claims and argues against Dershowitz that the outcome of reduced torture is deeply implausible. On the second claim, Brecher shows that the necessity defence would remain just as, if not more, common but be partly displaced into the judicial arena where there is little reason to think that judges will not be pliable to claims of necessity under such cloaks as national security. As for hypocrisy, the best solution to that would be to stop torture or openly admit its occurrence, and, in any case, if torture warrants did reduce the hypocrisy that mild benefit would have to be weighed against the substantial harms of the proposal, which include a reversion to a more barbarous society in which torture is legal.

There are some aspects of the torture problem that Brecher's restricted focus doesn't deal with fully although he touches upon them. One is the way in which concentration on the ticking bomb fantasy can obscure the fact that, behind the façade of righteous war, torture has become part of a way of life in the operations of democratic military forces. This is no doubt partially a consequence of the stress of war and the hatreds it stirs, but some of it is the result of the deliberate fostering of a permissive attitude to torture by military and political authorities, especially in the United States. This is an indication of the serious decline in democratic culture in the face of the elusive dread of terrorism, since torture is the very emblem of the authoritarian contempt for human rights that democracy opposes. Another point is the devastating effect that the widespread resort to torture has had upon many of the ordinary people who have been drawn into the practice of torture as a normal, tolerated part of service to their country. The primary wrong of torture, of course, resides in what is done to the victim, but the indirect effects of it cannot be ignored. Investigations into the high incidence of post-traumatic stress disorder amongst American troops returning from Iraq and Afghanistan seems to show that much of the disturbance comes from involvement in abuse (including torture) of prisoners and civilians. Another indirect effect of the practice of torture is the erosion of respect for Western democracy and its values that accompanies the spread of knowledge about the realities of the condoning and employment of torture by our official agencies. The supposed necessities of the war on terror may well destroy its effectiveness.

The concentration on interrogatory torture also tends to take torturers and their employers at their word about the purposes of much torture when, in fact, torture that has an ostensibly interrogational function is often principally aimed at something else, namely sending a message of fear and degraded status to a wider population. Much of the torture practiced by predominantly right wing regimes in Central and South America was performed with a façade of interrogational procedure, but the torturers often didn't care about the validity of the information as long as the victim broke and revealed names, any names, so that more victims could be procured and panic, demoralisation and a breakdown of trust could be spread.

A serious philosophical defect of Brecher's approach resides in his claim that defenders of torture in the ticking bomb scenario all "simply assume some variety of a utilitarian understanding of morality". On the face of it, this is simply false, since Walzer, for example, gives a version of the ticking bomb story as a prime example of "dirty hands", and Dershowitz invokes both Walzer and the dirty hands story in his defence of (legalized) torture. Brecher may think that dirty hands theorists are just utilitarians in disguise, but this claim would have to be argued for, since they assert that, short of "supreme emergency", they are anti-utilitarian. Indeed, contrary to utilitarians they insist that the political leader does what is and remains morally wrong in making the correct decision to torture. In making his "necessary" decision to torture the rebel leader, Walzer's good politician continues to believe "that torture is wrong, indeed abominable, not just sometimes, but always." This is not a thought available to a utilitarian. It would have been worth exploring whether the dirty hands theorists might be able to block some of Brecher's extending objections mentioned above since their overriding of standard morality is restricted to supreme emergencies (at least on a common interpretation of dirty hands). Of course, there are grounds for doubt about the coherence of the dirty hands story, but its relevance to Brecher's concerns should have been addressed. In fact, I think that many of his criticisms of the utilitarian approach create similar problems for the dirty hands theorist since such a theorist usually relies upon what Walzer calls "a utilitarianism of extremity" to lay the ground for the dirty hands overruling of grave moral prohibitions. So my objection is more a concern for completeness of treatment rather than a fundamental rejection of Brecher's approach.

Some critics of the "applied turn" in philosophy have worried that philosophers find themselves drawn into a sort of complicity with corrupt but prevalent practices in the areas of their society that they examine. There is certainly a risk of this, but the best applied philosophical work avoids it, and is often stimulated by dissatisfaction with widely accepted norms and practices. Brecher's book is an excellent example of such work.