Toward a Pragmatist Metaethics

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Diana B. Heney, Toward a Pragmatist Metaethics, Routledge, 2016, 155pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138189492.

Reviewed by Todd Lekan, Muskingum University


Diana B. Heney's book has two basic aims. The first is to offer an interpretation of the vital meta-ethical insights from the tradition of classical pragmatism including C.S. Peirce, William James, John Dewey, and C.I. Lewis. The second is to apply some of these insights to contemporary meta-ethical debates, especially the issues of whether moral judgments are "truth apt" and whether general moral principles play a significant role in moral inquiry. Heney shows how pragmatism can offer compelling versions of both a cognitivist affirmation of the truth aptness of moral judgments and a generalist support for the role of principles in moral deliberation.

The book deserves responses within contemporary analytic ethics, and I predict that it will prove its value in that domain. Its review of the tradition of American philosophy is less successful but still, especially in the case of Peirce, offers fresh interpretations that rectify distorted views. Heney carefully explains the evolution of Peirce's thinking about whether ethics can be a normative science (pp. 19-27). Early in his career, Peirce seems to take a dim view of the prospects of ethics being the province of legitimate inquiry; but his later 1905 Cambridge lectures point the way towards regarding ethics as a legitimate science. Although Heney has interesting things to say about the moral philosophies of James, Dewey, and Lewis, she clearly regards their most valuable contributions as extensions of Peircian notions. While I think this Peircian angle works well in revitalizing Lewis' unfortunately neglected pragmatist value theory, it tends to distort the distinctive contributions of James and Dewey. For example, Heney joins a long line of philosophers since Russell who chide James' will to believe doctrine for allowing truth to be determined by personal preferences. Heney takes Dewey's notion of a "situation," which underpins his ethical contextualism, to lead to the untenable implication that "moral philosophy has to be made anew from scratch each time a problematic situation arises" (p. 64).

Suffice to say, scholars of James' and Dewey's moral philosophy will take issue with these characterizations. While Heney's interpretations cannot be fully assessed here, I will offer a few corrective suggestions that might be worth further debate. Following Jennifer Welchman (2006), I read James' will to believe doctrine as arguing that under certain conditions -- especially those in which there are momentous, agent-shaping consequences for the believer -- a person has a right to consent to try out certain beliefs ahead of the evidence. James is not, on this reading, endorsing the dubious method that says the personally satisfying consequences of a belief make it true. In response to Heney's criticism of Dewey's contextualism, I would point to Dewey's view of habits as socio-psychological entities that have a history transmitted through social practices and institutions. Moral agents do not need to reinvent the principles and rules that guide them when confronted with recalcitrant experience. They can only see moral situations as having problematic aspects because of their acquired moral habits. Dewey holds that moral theory is simply a more reflective extension of the moral problem-solving processes already occurring in cultures that have attained a certain degree of complexity. Moral philosophy cannot be "made anew" for each problem it encounters any more than other practical inquiries such as medicine or engineering can. These inquiries address problems over and against a fund of prior learning embodied in habits, practices, and traditions.

I wonder whether the book would have been better served if its campaign for a Peircian metaethics were confined to contemporary meta-ethics. As it stands, the historical review is not able to sufficiently represent the depth of either James' or Dewey's ethical writings, and this has the consequence of downplaying their distinctive contributions to moral theory. The narrative offered is one of relative harmony in Peirce's philosophical tent. Ideas that do not fit snugly into Peirce's framework are left undeveloped in the cold. Nevertheless, Heney's application of Peircian ideas to the contemporary scene in meta-ethics is very valuable. To that I now turn.

Heney divides recent pragmatism into expressivist pragmatists such as Price and Rorty and cognitivist pragmatists, with whom she aligns herself, including Cheryl Misak and Robert Talisse. The cognitivist pragmatists regard Peirce's account of truth "as the most defensible one offered by any classical pragmatist" (p. 148). Heney rightly understands Peirce's approach to truth to be primarily epistemic, rather than metaphysical. Contemporary Peircians argue that a pragmatic elucidation of the conception of truth reveals important connections between truth and our practices of inquiry. While not analytically defining truth as "what would be agreed to in inquiry," cognitivists like Misak (2004) take Peirce to be elucidating the role that truth plays in our practices. True beliefs are durably reliable in the face of relevant reasons and evidence. Genuine inquiry aims at the acquisition of true beliefs. On the Peircian view, anyone who undertakes such inquiry must accept certain regulative assumptions, which are fundamentally practical insofar as they express a hope necessary to reasonably engage in inquiry. Heney claims that these "regulative assumptions are not products of inquiry, as our beliefs are, but working hypotheses that we hold steady for the purpose of inquiry itself" (p. 17).

Heney distinguishes between two broad categories of guiding principles: one includes assumptions that must be accepted by any inquiry whatsoever. The second category includes "local" regulative assumptions, which apply only because of the subject matters of particular inquiries. Neither kind of regulative assumptions are grounded in a Kantian transcendental reason. They are, however, a priori in the sense that they antecede inquiry as ways in which humans organize thought. They are "necessary," but only if one wants to engage in genuine inquiry.

Heney does not accept Dewey's contention that regulative assumptions are the outcomes of inquiry. She asks, "If regulative principles of inquiry can be the product only of past inquiries, how can inquiry begin at all?" (p. 58). I think Dewey can offer a plausible answer, by articulating what he calls the "existential matrix" of inquiry. Dewey theorizes about the biological development of "life behavior" involving phases of disturbances and re-calibration between organisms and environments. This offers a "pattern [that] definitely foreshadows the general pattern of inquiry" (Dewey, 1991, p. 40). Heney's application of the notion of regulative assumptions to moral inquiry should, I think, retain much of its value irrespective of how the debate about their origins is settled. She offers convincing arguments for the relevance to moral theory of two key regulative assumptions from the first category: the principle of bivalence and the postulate of reality. Heney's use of the bivalence and reality postulates helpfully frames her approach to the issue of the cognitive status of moral judgments. If morality is a domain of genuine inquiry, then we must accept that moral judgments are either true or false (the bivalence principle) and that a moral reality (the postulate of reality) constrains moral judgments.

Heney shows that morality has the kinds of features that make it a fit subject for inquiry, and thus for the reality and bivalence assumptions. Consider the reality postulate. Heney argues that the pragmatist tradition has always had a rich and expansive understanding of experience, challenging traditional empiricism's limited account of experience as of sensory objects. As a response to a racist insult, a feeling of outrage apprehends aspects of social reality. The fact that the objects of moral responses are relative to humans makes them no less real. Careful attention to such moral phenomenological data, offers at least a prima-facie case that moral statements respond to reality, and so are fit candidates by inquiries governed by the reality postulate.

Heney canvasses popular arguments for cognitivism, offering pragmatist refinements on them. Of particular note is her contention that non-cognitivism, like relativism, cannot make sense of the corrigibility of moral judgments: "Correction of what one says becomes nonsensical; all correction would instead focus on when or how it was said" (p. 99). In other words, it could never be rational to change one's moral beliefs on the basis of facts or evidence. As she puts it, the non-cognitivist approach "has a hard time making discourse as anything other than collective reporting of our own inner states" (p. 98). Following Cian Dorr (2002), Heney shows how non-cognitivism entails the impossibility of judgments about the rationality of inferences from statements about right and wrong to factual statements. Consider this argument pattern: "If x is wrong, then some fact F will obtain. X is wrong. Therefore, some fact F will obtain." If "X is wrong" refers to nothing more than a non-cognitive attitude, then all manner of wishful thinking is warranted. So, for example, claims about right and wrong actions used in inferences to beliefs about divine rewards and punishments would never be rationally assessable. Heney also offers several very penetrating criticisms of Huw Price's pragmatist global expressivism. Her analysis is nuanced and sympathetic. Readers interested in these contemporary debates will learn much about the depth of neo-pragmatist contributions to meta-ethics.

In chapter six, Heney makes a good case that pragmatism supports a moderate generalism, against the radical moral particularism of philosophers such as Jonathan Dancy. Heney argues that when applied to moral judgment, guiding principles are neither absolutist universal nor defeasible reasons. She argues that they are not absolute and universal because they are contingent upon certain practices of inquiry. Moreover, they are "locally necessary; that is, necessary for the particular enterprise they support" (p. 119). She claims that part of the problem with absolutist theories such as Kant's is the assumption that all moral value can be reduced to one kind of principle. A more plausible approach would acknowledge heterogeneous moral principles that are locally, not universally applicable.

While rejection of universal absolute moral principles seems like a central entailment of any pragmatist view of moral judgment, it might appear as if pragmatism must accept the defeasibility of moral principles. Wouldn't they have to be defeasible if they were not absolute and universal? Heney answers: "guiding principles regulate one's approach to the problem rather than being employed as a tool for solving the problem." (p. 120). The reason they "regulate" but do not "solve" problems, Heney suggests, is that they alone are not sufficient to specify right actions. Therefore, as indeterminate regulative considerations, they are not the sorts of things that may or may not be defeated by other moral considerations. This seems right. However, I wonder why Heney disparages the "tool" metaphor for moral principles. This metaphor is central to Dewey's (1985) account of principles as well as contemporary developments of his moral theory such as Gregory Fernando Pappas (2007, pp. 51-55) and Todd Lekan (2003, pp. 96-101). These Deweyan accounts endorse a moderate generalism, based on a view of moral principles that escapes Dancy's criticisms. So, I am not sure why Heney thinks that Deweyans join Richard Rorty in thinking that there is" putative support for particularism to be found within classical pragmatism" (p. 125). Dewey (1985) says, principles "supply standpoints and methods which will enable the individual to make for himself an analysis of the elements of good and evil in the particular situation in which he finds himself. No genuine moral principle prescribes a specific course of action" (p. 280). As a "tool for analyzing a special situation" (p. 280), a moral principle regulates moral inquiry, but does not by itself determine outcomes of inquiry. Principles alone cannot bear the justificatory weight for decisions about what specific actions should or should not be done. I think this is close to Heney's point when she claims, "rather than saying of a particular moral question or moral dilemma 'here's what ought to be done,' regulative assumptions only equip us with a theoretical scaffold that allows us to make assessments of the sort, 'is this the kind of question that inquiry can rightly be applied to?'" (p. 120).

Notice, though, that in this passage Heney seems to be talking about global regulative assumptions that address the fundamental question of whether any inquiry is possible, rather than the local regulative assumptions that govern specific kinds of subject matters, in this case particular moral assessments of practices and actions. It is on this point that I want to offer some clarifications regarding the differences between global and local regulative assumptions that I think are in the spirit, if not the letter, of Heney's position.

I take my cue from Heney's suggestive observations in an endnote. She claims that Rawls' political, non-metaphysical principles of justice fit the profile of local regulative assumptions (p. 31). As "local" they are not necessary because "people are not constituted so as to necessarily live only in constitutional democracies" (p. 31). Principles of liberal justice apply only under certain conditions within a moral tradition. Furthermore, the pragmatist will want to stress that even within those appropriate conditions, liberal justice is only one among many moral values. In these respects, justice principles are properly local. On the other hand, P.F. Strawson's claim that freedom is a necessary presupposition of all judgments of praise and blame is an "essential hypothesis for moral assessment" (p. 31). Put another way, this kind of global moral regulative assumption is necessary for the very existence of meaningful moral judgments to which we are mutually accountable.

Putting this all together, we can look in two different directions -- either towards the governing regulative assumptions of inquiry or towards the specific problematic situation to which inquiries apply. As we look towards problematic situations, we use moral principles as local moral assumptions that help us to analyze problematic situations. Principles of fidelity, justice, beneficence and the like are instruments for moral inquiries, which are used to formulate hypotheses for resolving moral problems. Looking in the other direction towards the structure of inquiry itself, we see how moral inquiry is governed by the global regulative assumptions such as bivalence and reality that apply to any inquiry. Less universal, but still global for the entire enterprise of morality, we find global moral regulative assumptions such as Strawson's freedom assumption. Other assumptions might include claims about the cognitive and emotional dispositions necessary for moral deliberation, for example empathic and reasoning capacities.

I want to conclude by applauding Heney's contention that one of the key virtues of a pragmatist moderate generalism is its ability to explain moral learning. General moral principles -- be they the local or global variety -- make possible moral education. At the very least, learning requires noticing how problems do and do not resemble other relevantly similar situations, and this means using general moral notions. The topic of moral learning is undeveloped in contemporary analytic meta-ethics. Heney shows that the time is ripe for pragmatism to shift attention to it.


Dewey, John. (1985). The Later Works Volume 7: Ethics, ed. J.A. Boydston. Southern Illinois University Press.

Dewey, John. (1987). The Later Works Volume 12: Logic: The Theory of Inquiry, ed. J.A. Boydston. Southern Illinois University Press.

Lekan, Todd. (2003). Making Morality: Pragmatist Reconstruction in Ethical Theory. Nasvhille, Vanderbilt University Press.

Misak, C.J. (2004). Truth and the End of Inquiry. Oxford University Press.

Pappas, Gregory Fernando. (2008). John Dewey's Ethics: Democracy as Experience. Indiana University Press.

Welchman, Jennifer (2006). "William James and the Ethic of Self-Experimentation." Transactions of the Charles. S. Peirce Society, 42 (2), pp. 229-241.