Towards a Critical Theory of Society: The Collected Papers of Herbert Marcuse: Volume Two

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Herbert Marcuse, Towards a Critical Theory of Society: The Collected Papers of Herbert Marcuse: Volume Two, ed. Douglas Kellner, Routledge, 2001, 242 pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-415-13781-0

Reviewed by David Ingram, Loyola University, Chicago


As a philosophy graduate student, political activist, and close acquaintance of Herbert Marcuse (1898 - 1979) during the last seven years of his tenure at UCSD I was continually perplexed by his deep reverence for the classics - especially Aristotle - and his equally self-deprecating attitude toward all variety of theoretically untutored political activism. Unfortunately, he adopted the same attitude with respect to his own work, which he simply refused to discuss. However, the famous professor who could be cajoled into conducting private readings of Hegel only with the greatest reluctance (but who would most willingly teach Aristotle’s Metaphysics), could be persuaded at a moment’s notice to speak at virtually any student demonstration, no matter how humble the cause.

The lectures, essays and correspondence assembled in this volume - the second in a projected series of six volumes containing both previously published and unpublished works (including photographs) - reflect not the famous academic scholar of Hegel, Marx, and Freud, but the personally engaged political firebrand who was rightly regarded as the guru of the New Left and student anti-war movements. Together, they span a period that began with the pessimism of the late McCarthy era and end with the pessimism of the post-Watergate era, broken only by a brief period of revolutionary optimism in the late sixties. They chronicle both the development of Marcuse’s mature critique of “one-dimensional society” and his most utopian yearnings for a liberated society.

Several signature traits of the Marcuse style immediately come into view when reading these essays. They reflect an astounding synthesis of philosophy, social science, economics, and literature. Yet they are not academic works intended to persuade intellectual skeptics of the cause being argued for. Since almost all were written during the emotion-charged period spanning the Vietnam War, the Civil Rights Struggle, and the student movement, they have the rhetorical ring of political manifestos. Most were clearly intended for consumption by student activists and like-minded professors who would have shared Marcuse’s Marxist slant on the state of global capitalism.

Therein lies their appeal (or lack thereof, depending on one’s political perspective). Marcuse had a knack for combining “high” culture and “low” culture in his writing in a way that defies easy description. True to the Marxist credo linking theory and practice, he could soar to the dizzying heights of speculative theory (mainly Freudian and Marxist) - interlaced with a good dose of Hegel, Kant, Nietzsche, or any other philosopher who caught his fancy - and then just as swiftly dive to the depths of popular counterculture, replete with the poetic (and occasionally scatological) argot of the young people he so adored. Behold, for instance, this passage, excerpted from a hitherto unpublished essay written around 1970 and included in the volume under the title, “Cultural Revolution”:

The fight will be won when the obscene symbiosis of opposites is broken - the symbiosis between the erotic play of the sea (its waves rolling in as conquering males, breaking by their own grace, turning female; caressing each other, and licking the rocks) and the booming death industries at its shores, between the flight of the white birds and that of the grey Airforce jets, between the silence of the night and the farts of the motorcycle… . (p. 157)

It may not be good poetry but it is poetry nonetheless. Throughout his life Marcuse always insisted that the most revolutionary literature was not didactic social theory or political propaganda but poetry, music and art - including (heaven forbid!) decadent bourgeois art.

In fact, despite all its heavy-handed use of Marxist economic theory, Marcuse’s brand of Marxism was far from orthodox. Like his Frankfurt School compatriots, he repudiated economic determinism and, along with it, the reverent worship of Soviet-styled bureaucratic socialism, which he rather insouciantly lumped together with Western-styled “state monopoly capitalism.” In his opinion, both of these systems were markedly less free than the classical liberal regime they replaced - so much so that he deigned to call both of them totalitarian and neo-fascist.

Strong, unqualified judgments like these abound in the lectures and essays contained in this collection. But they are usually qualified in other passages. While condemning “bourgeois democracy” as a sham in which competing parties only appear to represent different alternatives, and while mocking freedom of speech as a false and repressive toleration of dissent, Marcuse - dialectician that he was - could also be expected to defend the “progressive” content of these classical liberal shibboleths when pressed to do so. By the mid-seventies, he would confide to many of us that his own critique of bourgeois democracy and repressive tolerance had been overwrought, and was certainly misplaced during a time of severe reaction (which he considered the post-Vietnam War period to be).

Here we see another defining feature of Marcuse’s style that sets him apart from Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer, but which brings him somewhat closer to the second-generation critical theory tradition of Jurgen Habermas. Because he took seriously the Marxist call to unite theory and practice, Marcuse’s writings - including even his most theoretical works - always had a contemporaneous quality about them. In fact, the obligation to reappropriate theoretical traditions in light of contemporary historical events was what initially attracted him to Martin Heidegger, whose student he was in the late twenties. Although he sharply broke with the reactionary elements of Heidegger’s existentialism, he (like Sartre, another existentialist whom he greatly admired) made the Heidegger’s conception of historicity the centerpiece of his own brand of Marxism.

The end result of this strategy is made manifest again and again in Marcuse’s writing. It is encapsulated in the dialectical way he treats “historical concepts” like democracy, freedom, equality, and individuality. On the one hand, these “abstract” categories function ideologically to legitimate and maintain a repressive one-dimensional society that is anything but democratic, free, equal, and individualistic. On the other hand, their very abstractness transcends the concrete present in anticipating a fully realized utopian future.

Marcuse’s dialectical mode of philosophizing doubtless seemed to be confusing and evasive to many critics on both the Left and the Right. For many of them, extreme judgments couched in obscurantist prose were far too incendiary for what they perceived to be the dangerously anarchic proclivities of Marcuse’s revolutionary student audience - hence the frequent calls for his termination, resignation, or worse. Yet these criticisms miss their mark: the kind of detached conceptual analysis we might expect to emerge from the academy during more peaceful times simply seems inappropriate for the turbulent period of the sixties. Marcuse was right: these were revolutionary times. Even if they didn’t issue in the revolution he was hoping for, they did inaugurate fundamental and irrevocable changes in our understanding of gender, race, ecology, and global power; and the student movement was an essential factor in all of that.

The selections contained in this volume concisely articulate Marcuse’s vision of a revolutionary future. True to his Marxist revisionism, he saw this revolution less in economic and political terms than in cultural ones - a transvaluation of values, as Nietzsche put it. The abolition of capitalism and the instauration of democractic control of the means of production - at the level of local community boards as well as workplace management teams - was only the beginning. The virtual elimination of scarcity through automation - for Marcuse, a real possibility given the current development of science and technology - would make possible the total emancipation of the senses. Erotic energy would be diverted away from the false need to consume and produce; aggression and the need to dominate nature would be replaced by a “new science and technology” aimed at “pacifying life,” or liberating nature and humanity from their own narrow limitations and realizing their inherent aesthetic potentials. The key word in all this would be reconciliation and solidarity with fellow humans, animals, and nature.

In retrospect, it is hard to imagine this utopian vision withstanding the onslaught of today’s more skeptical - if not postmodern - sensibilities. Already, back in the seventies, more analytically and epistemologically rigorous “postmetaphysical” thinkers like Habermas were questioning the speculative biologism of Marcuse’s appeal to Freud’s instinctual economies (indeed, it eventually became a sore point in my own relationship to Marcuse). Combined with Marcuse’s penchant for ignoring harder questions - such as whether market economies and mass democratic institutions should be retained in some transformed permutation after the revolution - his unquestionable appeal to what was in fact a highly dubious metaphysics partly accounts for the eclipse of his thought during the eighties and nineties.

Another reason for Marcuse’s fall from popularity - and it is important to bear in mind how precipitous this fall was, since Marcuse’s name had become a household word throughout much of the Western world - was its historical concreteness. While historical relevance is clearly a strength when addressing the practical needs of the age, it is a deficit once those needs no longer exist. The revolutionary Marxist rhetoric of Marcuse’s writing seems woefully out of place in today’s New World Order, where neo-liberal ideology seems to subsume all democratic, egalitarian, and libertarian needs under one vision of the global marketplace.

But are these lectures, essays, and letters only of antiquarian interest for the most die-hard Marcuse enthusiast? Can we not learn something about our own times in reading them? In a retrospective tribute written on the occasion of the 100th anniversary of Marcuse’s birthday (appended as an Afterword to this collection), Habermas writes:

“the destructive implementation of accumulated wealth” is certainly less obvious than it was during the Vietnam War. But in the context of a globalizing capitalism, which causes unemployment and the price of stocks [Aktienkurse] to rise more or less in unison, Marcuse’s central diagnosis of a “fatal unity between productivity and destructivity” has been confirmed in another, no less drastic way (p. 236).

Like Marx before him, Marcuse’s diagnosis of the paradoxes of capital accumulation retain their validity even if his own premonitions of revolution do not. Marcuse’s diagnosis of the increasing concentration of power in the executive branch coupled with the unquestioned identification of the President with his office may have seemed at once valid and yet curiously outdated when they were first penned (shortly before Watergate). Today, with Congress largely abdicating its constitutionally delegated responsibility of oversight in the conduct of the “war against terrorism,” the press acceding to self-censorship and relying on the Bush administration/military high command’s account of the war’s progress, the public’s ranks firmly closed against any dissent from the current campaign, and the Justice Department drastically curtailing the civil liberties of foreign (mainly Middle Eastern) nationals suspected of links to terrorism, Marcuse’s views about the “repressive tolerance” of liberal democracy once again resonate.

Beyond that, it is difficult to assess the practical truth of Marcuse’s revolutionary diagnosis. But this much can be said. The coalition of workers, students, women, minorities, and the marginalized sectors of the Third World that Marcuse saw as the new revolutionary vanguard - a vanguard that seemed on the verge of coalescing during one brief moment in the streets of Paris in 1968 but that was nowhere to be found in U.S. - now seems to be taking shape, however haltingly. It is anyone’s guess how far this movement will go - the events of September 11 seem to have overtaken and overshadowed the anti-globalization demonstrations that shook the world just a year ago. But if the movement can successfully publicize the intersecting interests that collectively predict the emerging catastrophe of global capitalism, then perhaps Marcuse’s utopian hopes will someday be vindicated.