Towards a Polemical Ethics: Between Heidegger and Plato

Towards A Polemical Ethics

Gregory Fried, Towards a Polemical Ethics: Between Heidegger and Plato, Rowman and Littlefield, 2021, 294pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786610003.

Reviewed by Robert Metcalf, University of Colorado Denver


The title of Gregory Fried’s book led me to expect a study of the polemical character of ethical life, drawing on insights from both Plato and Heidegger—which makes sense, given that both thinkers have much to teach us about polemos and ‘the ethical.’ But in fact, the word, “towards,” in the title, points to something more interesting and more ambitious than what I had expected, for the book intends to lay out what the author describes as a “propaedeutic metaethics” in the precise sense of “establishing the grounds for the possibility of an ethical life, norms, and morality, as well as the customs, laws, and institutions needed to sustain such a life” (4). Such a project entails, among other things, a phenomenological account of human life with an eye to our historical and embodied situatedness, our relatedness to ourselves and others, as well as our way of inhabiting language, through ideation and intimation. Fried’s phenomenological account is structured “between Heidegger and Plato,” as he puts it, because it reformulates key concepts from Heidegger while moving toward the conception of “situated transcendence” that he finds illustrated most vividly in the cave allegory of Plato’s Republic. While some Plato scholars may be wary of using Heideggerian concepts to unpack Plato’s texts, and while, on the other side, some Heideggerians may chafe at the charge of “relativism” and “decisionism” in Heidegger’s thought, the critical confrontation—Auseinandersetzung—between Plato and Heidegger that is advanced in this book makes for an engaging and incisive work of philosophy.

The key concept of ‘situatedness,’ which Fried sketches out in great detail in the book, captures insights from Heidegger’s existential analytic of Dasein in Being and Time. Fried captures it this way: “To be properly human, for Heidegger, means to be Da-Sein: Being-here, situated in a historical reality . . . the truth is always given as a time-bound, particular openness to a world of meaning that has a necessary limit, a definite finitude” (14). To be sure, in his writings in the 1930s and 1940s, Heidegger moved toward an understanding of ‘situatedness’ using the language of “rootedness,” Boden-ständigkeit, that was continuous with the Nazi rhetoric of Blut und Boden—a point which Fried explores in connection with Emmanuel Faye’s critique of Heidegger (44). Nonetheless, Fried argues that the basic concept of “rootedness” is one that allows for reinterpretation and reformulation along lines diametrically opposite to those of fascist thought, and thus allows for a philosophically illuminating sense of our historical/linguistic ‘situatedness.’ Most importantly, while the word, “rootedness,” may suggest a kind of stability or even immobility in the sense of resistance-to-change, Fried fleshes it out in terms of one’s situated placement in a historical sphere of meaning that can and will undergo disruption. As he writes: “Our situated rootedness will always be subject, eventually, to disruptive uprootings of meaning that displace us into unmeaning . . .” (65).

Fried’s thinking on rootedness/uprootings as a meta-ethical structure relates closely to the distinction elaborated in the book between what he calls “echonic” philosophy—i.e., philosophy understood as the secure possession of knowledge or wisdom—and, on the other hand, “zetetic” philosophy, i.e., philosophy understood as an ongoing, life-long search or ‘seeking’ modeled on the activity of Socrates, as dramatized in Plato’s dialogues. While “disruptive uprootings of meaning” may threaten philosophy in the echonic sense, they are precisely the provocations of wonder that fuel philosophy in the zetetic sense, opening up possibilities of rethinking and revising one’s understanding. Indeed, Fried’s phenomenological account of ‘ideation’ and ‘intimation’ in the book lays out conditions for the possibility of zetetic philosophy, which, on Fried’s analysis, requires the integration of something like Plato’s forms or ideas and the historical situatedness of human life. Fried explains as follows:

if not the forms or ideas, then something like them is necessary as a hypothesis for any specific ethical engagement, in deed or discussion, with both persons and problems about justice, courage, piety, or any other ethical virtue or political principle. . . . We would not be able to listen to one another, which requires harkening generously to both the meaning as intended in what others say and to what also exceeds their intended meaning as unsaid but as potentially the ground for discovery and reconciliation in confrontation . . . without something like the idea, projected in any discussion of what is at-issue ethically as the form of the matter in question, ethical life would not be possible. (88)

In the book’s concluding chapter, Fried restates the decisive role played by ‘ideas’ in his understanding of ‘situated transcendence’ when he writes: “ethical life, which includes political life, requires the projection of the idea as a constitutive feature of our polemical, hermeneutical, and historical existence” (268).

The ongoing struggle to make sense of the world interpretively, confronting irruptions of unmeaning and challenges to one’s understanding, is what Fried calls polemos in the book. “This is the heart of our polemical situatedness as human beings,” he writes: “that the world as it makes sense to us also drives us to confront interpretively what does not, yet, make sense—and the resolution of this ‘yet’ is forever postponed in the primal strife” (38). Fried clarifies the sense of a “polemical ethics” in part by drawing on Socrates’ account of the polemical character of dialectic in Plato’s Republic, where, it is argued, we have been brought up from childhood with convictions [dogmata] about justice and other moral concepts such that, when we are then exposed to Socratic elenchus and its disorienting implications, we are susceptible of falling into profound disbelief about all that we previously believed (Rep. 539b–c). Interpreting the profound disbelief at issue in Socrates’ words as a form of nihilism, Fried argues that a polemical ethics requires learning how to

let go of opinions without falling into the despair of utter disorientation or nihilism. . . . This means engaging in the zetetic life of philosophy . . . trusting one’s intimations but being willing to discard them if they fail in the polemos of interpreting the world with both honesty and charity. (154)

Conversely, as explained later in the book, refusing the possibility that “new interpretation is going always to be needed in the polemos of the historical situatedness of human political life” is, Fried asserts, “a failure of responsibility” (265). Indeed, Fried captures the sense of “responsibility” at issue here in his conception of Socratic piety, i.e., “the epistemic-ethical responsibility of the zetetic philosopher” (82).

Looking to Plato’s Socrates as the model of zetetic philosophy, Fried marks out important differences between his own interpretation of Plato’s texts and those found in Heidegger’s writings. For one thing, Heidegger’s agenda-driven orientation toward Plato leads him to look past the irony with which Plato dramatizes Socrates as a zetetic philosopher very different in nature from the “philosopher” theorized at great length in the Republic. Furthermore, while Heidegger identifies Plato with Platonism, and takes up the latter with an eye to nihilism in the development of Western metaphysics, Fried’s aim is to carve out an alternative interpretation of Plato which allows for a critique of Heidegger’s philosophical commitments. Accordingly, whereas Heidegger treats the cave allegory in Plato’s Republic as a decisive turning-point in the metaphysical determination of truth, Fried treats the cave allegory as an illustration of “situated transcendence” that calls for extensive philosophical exploration and analysis. The cave offers an image of human life, since, as mortals, human beings “must naturally be somewhere, grounded in a physicality and materiality and historical situatedness that we do not choose” (183). Zetetic philosophy is more ‘at home’ in acknowledging situatedness than is echonic philosophy, and Fried elaborates on the ‘cave-light’ dimension of zetetic philosophy when he writes:

the initial adjusting of the eyes to the fire is the dawning of historical consciousness: the realization that ways of understanding, both of ethical norms and of the world itself, are historical; that our opinions, our ideology . . . are to some significant extent historically contingent . . . [Authenticity/Eigentlichkeit] entails being able to return to and embrace that world through revitalized interpretations, realizing meanings implicit but previously unrealized in one’s given existence. (216)

To my mind, one of the most significant contributions made by this book is its attention to the multiple and interconnected forms of situatedness—including, for example, embodiment as one of these forms. He writes:

The body, as the inescapable situatedness of an existence we cannot choose or fully master, prevents the total fulfillment of philosophy in the echonic sense. . . . We cannot simply eliminate the distortions of perspective and inclinations that the shadows of the bodily cave lock us into as the medium of our historical situatedness. (183)

Situated transcendence requires, Fried argues, something like phronēsis, the ability to integrate knowledge of abstract, universal truths (the ideas) with the contingencies of human situatedness. In keeping with the attention to embodiment, Fried unpacks the deeper meaning of phronēsis in terms of its ‘rootedness’ in the Greek word, phrēn:

The phrēn is the midriff, the seat of an embodied knowing that is tied to the intuitive, intimate, and familiar, the furthest thing from the conceptual knowing of metaphysical philosophy. Hence, the verb phronein means to know in your gut, to have an instinctive feel for what fits with the familiar, as well as what breaks with it. (238)

For Heidegger, too, phronēsis

is the work of phronein, thinking from the phrēn, the heart of our connection to a particular place, time, and community. . . . It is an intensely sensitive attunement to the radical finitude of historical situatedness . . . a form of care, Sorge, that reveals to Dasein the complexities of its situated Being-with-others in the Da. (252)

But even if, on Fried’s reading, Heidegger’s peculiar understanding of phronēsis “leads to a radical relativism and an intense form of decisionism” (253), what matters at the end of the day is not the deficiencies in Heidegger’s interpretation of phronēsis and historical situatedness, but the deficiencies in our own understanding of, and relation to, the moral and political tradition that situates us today. For this reason, Fried directs the reader toward a ‘deconstructive’ reinterpretation of the Declaration of Independence, and toward Frederick Douglass as an exemplar of the ‘polemical Platonist,’ i.e., “someone who enters into a deconstructive and, most importantly, a reconstructive dialogue with this tradition . . . [who] seeks a reconstituted polity grounded in a reinterpretation faithful to the meaning polemically latent in the Founding” (274–75). Fried addresses his and our own historical situatedness, in the 21st century, at certain moments in the book—for example, when alluding to the resurgent problem of fascism in our times, or to the Black Lives Matter movement and social unrest after the killing of George Floyd. In these ways the book brings together philosophical work on the meta-ethical significance of historical situatedness while remaining attuned to its own historical moment—an admirable achievement, and one worth looking to as a model for philosophical writing.