Towards an Epistemology of Ruptures: The Case of Heidegger and Foucault

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Arun Iyer, Towards an Epistemology of Ruptures: The Case of Heidegger and Foucault, Bloomsbury, 2014, 219pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441137678.

Reviewed by H.A. Nethery IV, Florida Southern College


Arun Iyer's remarkable text would be useful for anyone, scholar or novice, interested in Martin Heidegger and Michel Foucault, contemporary epistemology, historiography, philosophy of science, and the dialogue between analytic and continental philosophy. That it speaks to so many different areas is due to its subject matter: thinking. Iyer's goal is to use the work of Heidegger and Foucault to show us the possibility of thinking differently than we do now, i.e., the possibility of forms of thinking other than causal-inferential, representational, or logical thinking. Iyer deftly brings the work of these two philosophers into contact with traditional epistemology, history, and science throughout the text, showing the applicability of Heidegger and Foucault for contemporary debates in these areas. Furthermore, for scholars or beginners in the work of Heidegger or Foucault, Iyer is able to explain and apply some of their most difficult concepts and texts with an astounding clarity. The main drawback of the book is its brevity -- the implications of nearly all of the concepts that Iyer works through could be drawn out much more (though, to be fair, this is the project of his second book) (177). In this brief review, I frame the debate to which Iyer's text contributes and outline the structure of the text, with an eye toward showing its underlying unity and its implications for contemporary debates in epistemology, history, mathematics, and science. I end with some closing words on the text and critical comments.

Iyer's text is aimed primarily at traditional epistemology, which, he argues, begins with a split between subject and object "and then tries to ask how the subject can know the object" (173). If we begin with a split between the subject and object, then all lines of inquiry fall into the pattern of trying to know the object better or more clearly. This pattern is always one of linear progression -- the history of epistemology is of the various attempts to know the object as it is in-itself. For Iyer, the dichotomy between subject and object within epistemology is directly related to representational, logical, and causal-inferential forms of thinking. However, the subject/object dichotomy is not specific to epistemology. Rather, Iyer shows how this split, and underlying form of thought, permeates historiography and science as well. In history, we look at the history of human beings as a kind of progress towards some form of absolute morality or knowledge. In science, the split between subject and object manifests itself, according to Iyer, as a conflict between how the world appears to us in our experience and how the world actually is (understood scientifically).

Iyer's text is a response to the traditional account of thinking and epistemology outlined above, by showing that it is possible for us to think differently. This is accomplished through the use of the work of Heidegger and Foucault. For Iyer, both of these philosophers show us that it is possible to think differently than we do now, i.e., that thought is not exhausted by representational, logical, or causal-inferential thinking (47). As such, his text is not an attempt to unify the work of Heidegger and Foucault, but to use their insights to show us that thinking otherwise is possible. The radicality and novelty of Heidegger and Foucault's accounts of knowledge is that neither philosopher begins his analyses from a presupposed split between subject and object; rather, "They investigate the conditions that give rise to this distinction in the first place" (174). For each, Iyer argues, there is an anonymous and asubjective form of thought out of which subjects and objects emerge, though each philosopher understands this form of thought in radically different ways.

For Heidegger, this form of thought is called inceptual thinking -- an active and creative form of thought by the subject, in which the dichotomy between subject and object emerges (45). For Foucault, this form of thought is called discourse -- an "anonymous network of relations" (119), "which are neither purely subjective nor purely objective but which make possible the existence of subjects and objects and also facilitate the relationships between them" (117). That is, for Heidegger the dichotomy between subject and object emerges as one actualized form among other concrete possibilities found in inceptual thinking, while Foucault argues that the split emerges from the way in which knowledge and practices are arranged within a given society's discursive formation (e.g., the Renaissance or Classical periods).

The text is divided into five chapters; the first three focus on developing Heidegger's notion of inceptual thinking, and the final two examine Foucault's concepts of discourse and archaeology. The first chapter examines the development of Heidegger's idea of inceptual thinking from the transcendental framework found in his early work Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics to the ontological framework in his later text, the Beiträge. That is, for Heidegger, conceptual knowledge is founded on a prior asubjective and anonymous form of inceptual thinking. For Iyer, the beginning of this argument can be found in Heidegger's book on Kant, in which Heidegger argues that in order for us to have a split between subject and object, we must first form a kind of "preliminary horizon" within which beings can be encountered at all (14). This preliminary horizon, according to Iyer, is for Heidegger primarily temporal: the transcendental power of the imagination we find in Kant is a prior arrangement and application of temporality to pure understanding and pure intuition. Iyer interprets this as a form of thinking prior to thinking (20), and thus that "the dualities [of subject and object] are all secondary with regard to a primordial unity (or a fundamental root) from which these dualities stem" (43).

Iyer argues that this basic notion becomes the idea of inceptual thinking found in the Beiträge, but within an ontological rather than transcendental framework. Heidegger's focus in the Beiträge is to show that conceptual thinking as such is founded on a form of nonconceptual thought. Specifically, our interpretation of our encounter with objects as one of representation is the historical actualization of merely one form of encountering objects. That is, inceptual thinking is a kind of preliminary encounter with objects, within which we grasp the various concrete possibilities of interpreting that object. Conceptual or representational thought is then merely one actualization of a set of concrete possibilities, and inceptual thinking is a kind of grasping of these other possibilities. This form of thinking is asubjective and anonymous because how we think of ourselves and objects emerges from this more basic form of thinking.

The second and third chapters are devoted to fleshing out Heidegger's notion of inceptual thinking in more detail. Chapter Two focuses on elucidating the object of inceptual thinking and the inceptual thinker (48). For Iyer, the object of inceptual thought is be-ing (Seyn): a word created by Heidegger to designate a level primordial to what we understand as being (Sein). That is, what we think of as being is an interpretation based on a more fundamental understanding of be-ing, or the various concrete possibilities that we encounter with objects. Being, understood in such and such a way, is thus an actualization of one of the concrete possibilities at the level of be-ing. The inceptual thinker is then designated as Da-sein (rather than the Dasein of Being and Time), or as a kind of position between subject and object, from which our understandings of both emerge (76).

Chapter Three examines how it is that an object of knowledge is constituted through inceptual thinking. Iyer sets this discussion up through the use of Husserl's transcendental idealism, as a kind of backdrop against which we can understand Heidegger (I will skip the discussion of Husserl and focus on Heidegger for the sake of brevity). Iyer argues that the object of knowledge is constituted, for Heidegger, historically. That is, our interpretation of knowledge is grounded in the metaphysics of a people (96). According to Iyer, by metaphysics Heidegger means the decision by the "Dasein of a people" to interpret our encounter with objects in one way rather than another (i.e., the actualization of one concrete possibility for interpretation among many). Iyer carefully traces the way in which Heidegger understands the various ways in which knowledge has been understood historically, from Ancient Greece to modernity. The implication of this discussion pertains directly to both epistemology and history: for Heidegger, the way we understand objects has gone through radical revisions and constitutes a history of ruptures rather than progression.

Chapters Four and Five shift to a discussion of Foucault, in which Iyer argues that we can find another form of asubjective and anonymous thought, though in a manner quite different from Heidegger. Again, Iyer's aim is to show that thinking differently is possible, and uses Foucault to show us another way in which this possibility can be understood. Chapter Four is dedicated primarily to a discussion of Foucault's notion of discourse, which Iyer argues is used interchangeably with "thought" in The Order of Things (117). For Iyer, discourse is a form of thought prior to conceptual thinking because discourse specifies the conditions under which something can be called true or false, valid or invalid. Discourse, Iyer argues, can be understood primarily as a field of knowledge and practices within which subjects understand themselves and the objects around them (119). With impressive clarity, Iyer then traces how, for Foucault, the way that we have understood ourselves and the world was "dissolved" and "replaced" within the Renaissance, the Classical, and the Contemporary periods. For example, between the Renaissance and Classical periods (and again in the Contemporary period), the idea of knowledge undergoes radical transformation. The point here is again to show us that the way we understand ourselves and the world is based on discourse, and discourses can dissolve and be replaced. In fact, along with Heidegger, one might say that any discourse is an anonymous and asubjective decision to interpret the world in one particular way rather than another.

The fifth chapter focuses on Foucault's notion of archaeology as a way of understanding this nonconceptual level of thought. Iyer compares how Edmund Husserl and Foucault understand the field of geometry. For Husserl, geometry begins with the constitution of an ideality (theorems) that can then be reactivated ad infinitum by later geometers (156). Foucault, on the other hand, examines geometry as a discursive formation, as the set of rules under which a statement can be said to be geometrically valid or invalid (159). Again, the point of this chapter is to show us that a specific way of thinking, i.e., geometrical thinking, is founded upon something prior to it. In the case of Husserl the prior foundation is the constitution of an ideality and in the case of Foucault, a discursive formation.

Iyer's text as a whole aims to show us that the way we think now (conceptually, representationally, logically, etc.) is one form out of other possible forms of thinking. His goal is not to show us these other forms (that will be the goal of his next book), but to instead show us their presence and possibility. He accomplishes this through a series of meditations on Heidegger's notion of inceptual thinking and Foucault's concept of discourse and discursive formations. In both cases, how we understand ourselves and the world around us emerges out of a more fundamental level. The implications of this for epistemology should be more or less obvious: perhaps knowledge as justified true belief is only form of out of other possible forms of understanding knowledge as such. As regards history, Iyer shows how this fundamental level of thinking (either inceptual thinking or discourse) does not allow for history as a kind of linear progression but instead shows us a history inherently capable of rupture: one interpretation of knowledge can be dissolved and replaced by another concrete possibility without any guarantee of "progress."

Iyer's discussions of Heidegger and Foucault will be interesting and insightful to both scholars of these philosophers and novices just now introducing themselves to their work. For the scholar, Iyer's text is important for at least two reasons. First, his discussions bring together two philosophers who are normally held apart.[1] Second, this book deftly brings into relationship both "analytic" and "continental" schools of philosophy. Iyer describes, in clear terms, the relevancy of Heidegger and Foucault for contemporary analytic accounts of epistemology.

For the novice, Iyer's text serves as a nice entry-point into some of the most difficult figures in the tradition of continental philosophy. Later texts by Heidegger, for instance the Beiträge, are extremely difficult and complex, and Iyer is able to explicate these later arguments by Heidegger in clear and concise terms. Similarly, Foucault's The Order of Things is often regarded as one of his most difficult texts, due in particular to his discussion of the Contemporary period in the later chapters. Again, Iyer reconstructs these arguments with a clarity that I have never seen before. That is, Iyer gives us in this book the clearest expositions of these difficult arguments that I have ever read.

If Iyer's book has any shortcomings, it is due to the brevity of the text itself. At only two hundred and nineteen pages (thirty of which are footnotes and references), Iyer does not work through the implications of the work of Heidegger and Foucault in as much detail as I would have liked. However, this is perhaps unfair, as Iyer states in the conclusion to his text that his next book will "systematize the implications of these programs by providing a coherent alternative framework for a theory of knowledge that harmonizes the deepest insights of traditional epistemology and those of Heidegger and Foucault" (177). In any case, Iyer's book focuses on such a dizzying amount of topics that it is only natural one would wish that the text were longer.

To conclude, I completely recommend this text to scholars and novices interested in Heidegger, Foucault, epistemology, or history, and I am excited to read Iyer's next book.

[1] Foucault’s only mentions of Heidegger are cryptic, and his distaste for phenomenology is usually read in such a way so as to preclude any positive comparison.