Towards Non-Being: The Logic and Metaphysics of Intentionality

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Graham Priest, Towards Non-Being: The Logic and Metaphysics of Intentionality, Oxford University Press, 2005, 208pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199262543.

Reviewed by JC Beall, University of Connecticut


The problem of intentionality is not one problem but a family of related problems. In philosophy of mind, the principal problem is to give an account of 'aboutness', what and where it is in the world. In philosophy of language and philosophical logic, intentionality poses the problem -- and familiar puzzles -- of intensional contexts; the problem is to specify the semantics and logic of intensional contexts (i.e., typically, linguistic contexts for which either existential generalization or substitutivity of identicals seems to fail). Graham Priest's book focuses squarely on the latter problem; its aim is to formulate and defend a meinongian -- in particular, a so-called noneism (pronounced, I guess, 'none-ism') -- metaphysics and its corresponding semantics and logic.

While it offers no account of what 'aboutness' is, Priest's book will be welcome among philosophers of language and logic, and analytic metaphysicians in general. I highly recommend the book to anyone interested in traditional puzzles of intensional contexts or the metaphysics of 'non-existent objects'. I also highly recommend the book to anyone interested in philosophical logic, in general. Priest is a gifted writer, and the book percolates with interesting ideas, especially if one has never seriously wrestled with the topic of meinongianism.

While the book is very readable, it is also fairly technical. Do not misinterpret that claim! That the book is fairly technical does not mean that it is hard to read! It's not. The technical competence required by the reader is a genuine requirement; however, the requirement is little more than classical first-order logic and an open mind towards non-classical semantics. Still, for purposes of this review (intended for a general philosophical audience), I will skip most of the technical details and, as a result, some of the more interesting gems of the book.

My aim, in what follows, is three-fold. I'll first present the basic thesis and novelty of Priest's book. I'll then briefly mention the structure of the book and aims of each chapter. Finally, I'll voice a potential worry about Priest's proposal. What I will not do, in any of the following, is compare Priest's account with its rivals (e.g., Fine, Griffin, Nolan, Parsons, Zalta, among others); Priest gives suitable references for such works. I will also not rehearse familiar objections or complaints against meinongian approaches (e.g., Russell, Quine, among others); such objections and complaints are addressed in the second half of Priest's book. (See 'Structure of the book' below.)


Priest's book is dedicated to the memory of Richard Routley (later Sylvan). The dedication, in this case, is a deep and significant one. In many respects, Priest's book is a development of, and significant improvement on, Routley/Sylvan's famous Exploring Meinong's Jungle, in particular, Routley/Sylvan's noneism, which is a generalization -- and, in many respects, simplification -- of Meinong's own doctrines. While Meinong held that being divides into existence and subsistence, Routley held that being amounts to existence, and that anything that doesn't exist is quite simply non-existent. A noneist accepts that there are non-existent objects; however, against Meinong, a noneist posits no grades of being into existence, 'subsistence', or what-have-you. If you don't exist, you're non-existent -- not some 'subsistent' being. (NB: readers thinking that much of this is mere terminological quibble are directed to Part II of Priest's book, wherein Priest tackles just such objections -- e.g., whether noneism is just platonism with additional quantifiers.)

A principal commitment of noneism is the so-called Characterization Principle:

(CP) An object has the properties (or exemplifies the characteristics) that it is characterized as having.

Consider the following conditions: is a philosopher, is a superhero, is made of steel, is 3.5 inches tall. Let A(x) be the conjunction of those conditions. Suppose that we characterize Agnes -- a character of fiction, if you want -- via A(x). A consequence of (CP) is that Agnes exemplifies A(x), that is, that Agnes is a philosopher and superhero and made of steel and 3.5 inches tall.

But is (CP) right in its fully unrestricted form? Consider the following condition, for arbitrary B:

(C) x=x & B

If we characterize Max via (C), then, where m is Max, (CP) gives m=m & B. But B was arbitrary, and so everything follows.

The standard response to such triviality-engendering conditions is to restrict (CP) in some fashion. The characterization problem is to specify which characteristics (or properties), among some class of characterizing characteristics, are covered in (CP). Much of past work on 'non-existent objects' centers on the characterization problem, so understood.

The spirit of noneism has it that (CP) is unrestricted: any characterizing properties are had by the object so characterized. The trouble is that accommodating an unrestricted (CP) in a non-trivial language (i.e., a language in which some things are not true!) is a highly non-trivial task. Routley/Sylvan, despite the boldness and significant advances of his Jungle, never adequately found an adequate approach to an unrestricted (CP). One of the main contributions -- and, indeed, driving features -- of Priest's book is a solution to the given problem.

While Priest's solution is accompanied by a clear, formal picture, I will give just the basic idea here -- skipping the formal details. To his credit, the gist of Priest's proposal is fairly easy to state. (The formal picture clarifies subtleties that I'll here ignore.) In short, (CP) is entirely unrestricted; the key is that an object, characterized by condition C(x), need not exemplify C(x) at the actual world, but just at some world or other. Accordingly, Max and Agnes have their respective characterizing properties, just as (CP) requires; it's just that they needn't have them here -- but at some world or other. Still, they have them, and (CP) remains entirely unrestricted. (NB: To fill out the full story, we add more than the usual possible worlds; we also add different sorts of worlds, including impossible worlds, and also 'open worlds' at which matters are rather arbitrary. While, for purposes of this review, I will not go into the details of such various worlds, I will say that, by my lights, there's already independent reason for some such variety -- especially in the area of conditionals. But, for space reasons, I set that matter aside.)

The observant reader will immediately ask: aren't we back to the original characterization problem? After all, instead of talking about which properties are covered in (CP), now we have what, in effect, is the same problem: namely, a specification of which worlds, among all the (kinds of) worlds, are the ones at which an object exemplifies its characterizing characteristics.

Priest (in step with earlier work from Griffin and Nolan) has an answer that, by my lights, sits well in the current -- intentionality -- context. The answer, in short, is that an object has its characterizing properties at those worlds (partially) specified by a relevant representation. For example, Agnes enjoys her characterizing properties at those worlds (partially) specified by your representation as you read about her. (Of course, in her case, you haven't read much. This is one reason to expand our worlds beyond merely possible -- allowing, among other things, incomplete worlds.) A more familiar example is Sherlock Holmes or V (for Vendetta) or some such. Such non-existent objects don't exist here, but (CP) holds true: such objects enjoy their respective characterizing properties at those worlds (partially) specified by the relevant representations.

What Priest has given us is an account of noneism that apparently avoids triviality (everything being true) but nonetheless enjoys an unrestricted (CP). This is a significant achievement, irrespective of one's views on whether noneism is true. Moreover, though I have skipped the formal details in which such features shine, Priest's resulting account of intensional operators (or predicates) is both natural and plausible; it handles standard puzzles in a plausible way, and, with the background metaphysics, enjoys an explanatory force that one expects from an adequate account of intensional contexts. The overall framework is prima facie a natural, coherent picture of the semantics and metaphysics of intentionality (and intensionality). As above, I highly recommend the book.


Just for purposes of indicating the various (and many) topics that, for space reasons, this review is otherwise omitting, let me briefly indicate the structure of the book, doing little more than mentioning the central topic of each chapter.

The book divides into two parts. The first part covers the essential ingredients of Priestly noneism (as opposed to Routley/Sylvan noneism). (Routley/Sylvan noneism, perhaps surprisingly, is more conservative than Priest's, inasmuch as the former attributes existence only to concrete objects -- though, admittedly, the term 'conservative' seems somewhat out of place for either version.) In particular, part one lays out the basic logical background, and proceeds to formulate the chief semantical and metaphysical picture. The specific chapters break down as follows.

Part I: Semantics for Intentionality

Chapter 1: Intentional Operators. This sets up terminology and introduces the necessary semantic (and metaphysical) background to Priest's position. Worlds (possible, impossible, and 'open') are key here, and much of the chapter sets up worlds semantics for basic operators and connectives.

Chapter 2: Identity. This chapter explores 'identity' via a host of intensional puzzles. With puzzles in hand, Priest tackles the treatment of substitutivity of identicals.

Chapter 3: Objects of Thought. This chapter focuses chiefly on intentional predicates (as opposed to more familiar operators), with a formal semantics that highlights some of the subtleties (and novelties) of Priest's framework.

Chapter 4: Characterization and Descriptions. This chapter is the target of Part I. This is the chapter in which Priest formulates his answer to the characterization problem (see above).

Part II, in turn, defends Priestly noneism against standard and, in Chapter 8, non-standard objections. The chapters run as follows.

Part II: In Defense of Non-Being

Chapter 5: On What There Isn't. This is a rehearsal of Routley/Sylvan's critique of Quine's objections against meinongianism (and, by extension, against noneism). The chapter also nicely discusses other familiar objections against meinongianism (notably from Russell), and defends noneism against such objections.

Chapter 6: Fiction. A noneist treatment of fiction is a natural thought. In this chapter, Priest extends noneism to fiction and answers various objections (some novel).

Chapter 7: Mathematical Objects and Worlds. Like Chapter 6, this chapter extends Priestly noneism to mathematical objects and worlds, in general. A response to David Lewis' critique of (Routley/Sylvan) noneism is taken up and answered.

Chapter 8: Multiple Denotation. This chapter discusses a serious (and non-standard) objection to Priestly noneism, where (for present purposes) Priestly noneism is accompanied by a (Priestly) dialetheic approach to familiar paradoxes of circularity -- e.g., Liar, etc. The objection turns on a paradox of denotation due (originally) to Hilbert and Bernays but cogently presented by Priest. Priest's resolution of the paradox and, in turn, solution to the given objection involves a revision of ordinary principles governing denotation. Because the problem is fairly technical, I omit discussion here; however, anyone interested in meinongianism, or philosophical logic in general, should read this chapter.

Overall, the chapters are nicely organized, and the overall result is a clear, tightly knit discussion that advances the prospects of a meinongian approach to intentionality (and intensionality).


Let me end this review with one potential worry that, fortunately, needn't involve getting into the technical details of Priest's account, although it requires a bit of setting up. I do not present the worry as a fatal problem, but rather as a tension in Priest's overall position.

What is attractive about Priestly noneism is that it purports to accommodate natural, meinongian ideas without ad hoc constraints. This is particularly evident in one of the chief targets of the book, namely, the characterization problem (see above). One could restrict (CP) in a variety of ways, perhaps resorting to a firm 'metalanguage' versus 'object language' distinction. Such restriction is not the way of Priestly noneism (or, for that matter, Routley/Sylvan noneism). To his credit, the spirit of Priestly noneism is to accommodate any coherent notion that we appear to enjoy, either in intentional contexts or in our account of intentionality, more generally.

From the brief sketch above, it is clear that worlds play an essential role in Priest's account, with the actual world being unique. Many of the operators (and predicates) at issue in Priest's account are defined in terms of worlds. In particular, specifying the 'truth conditions' of such operators involves specifying their behavior at worlds. Since we have different types of worlds (e.g., possible, impossible, and 'open'), specifying the truth conditions of an operator involves specifying its behavior at all given types of worlds. This opens the option of having an operator that behaves one way at one type of world, but behaves differently (e.g., has different truth conditions) at a different type of world. For example, one might have a conditional → such that, for (say) type 1 worlds, A → B is true at w just if A is false at w or B is true at w, but at type 2 worlds A B is true at w just if the value of B at w is 'lower' than that of A at w. (This would be a crazy conditional. The example is merely to give the flavor of 'multiple type world' semantics.)

For convenience, let us say that an operator (or connective) O is uniform just if it has the same truth conditions at all (types of) worlds. Let us say that O is jumpy just if it isn't uniform.

Priest's account of intentional operators acknowledges a variety of jumpy ones (though I've skipped such details). I have no objection to jumpy operators (or predicates), and, in fact, think that there's motivation for such things from intentionality-independent phenomena. The worry, rather, is that Priestly noneism cannot coherently acknowledge a uniform actuality operator that, I think, is fairly familiar. If that's right, then there's a tension between the attractive accommodating spirit of Priestly noneism and the actual limits of accommodation. Let me briefly explain.

There seems to be a notion of actuality that is expressed by an entirely uniform actuality operator. Let @ be our operator. The target truth conditions run thus:

U) @A is true at w just if A is true (at the actual world), for any (type of) world w.

For present purposes, (U) can be read in 'rule form', that is, as an 'inference rule', if one wishes.

The idea is that, on the 'uniform' notion of actuality, we say that @A is true at a world exactly if A is true at the actual world -- i.e., just if A is true. This notion arises from the common thought, perhaps arising from taking worlds overly seriously, that 'actually' is always referring back to what's going on at our base (or actual) world. For example, it's not actually true that Connecticut is proud of Dubya Bush. Is there a world at which Connecticut is actually proud of Dubya Bush? On one (or more) conceptions of actuality, the answer may well be affirmative; however, on the 'uniform' notion, the answer is negative. If Connecticut isn't proud of Dubya, then there's no world (of any stripe) at which at this world -- the unique, actual world -- Connecticut is proud of Dubya. In effect, the 'uniform' or 'rigid' notion of actuality turns entirely on -- and, in some sense, is a redundant record of -- what is happening here, at the unique actual world. Other (non-actual) worlds might be confused or mistaken, in some sense, about what's happening A-wise here (at the unique actual world), but, in that case, we reject that @A is true at those worlds, at least on the target 'uniform' notion.

(The point might be made differently by talking about a 'rigid' name for the actual world. I should emphasize that, in that case, standard allegations about use-mention or meta-object-language confusions will not take root in the present context. As hinted at above, Priest will not accept that 'world talk' is strictly a metalanguage device, not properly part of our actual 'object language'.)

Now, I have not made the 'uniform' notion of actuality precise, but I think the idea is clear enough to raise the worry. Moreover, I'm not sure how much work such a uniform notion of actuality plays in our language, but, at least on the surface, it seems to be a recognizable notion of actuality -- probably one in addition to various others. (Alvin Plantinga, in his famous The Nature of Necessity, seems to have some such notion in mind, or at least implicit in his discussion of 'world-indexed properties' etc. (Again, see the above caveat against invoking standard use-mention or etc. confusions in the present context.)) If that's right, then the worry for Priest's proposal takes hold.

Consider the following condition.

(C*) x=x & @B

Suppose that we use (C*) to characterize Beetle (for convenience, b), where @ is our 'uniform' actuality operator governed by (U). (CP) guarantees that there's some world -- of some stripe (possible, impossible, open) -- at which

(C*.1) b=b & @B

is true. Call the given world 'w'. From Simplification, we have it that each conjunct of (C*.1) is true at w. (NB: this is trickier than I'm making out here. Simplification might fail at certain types of worlds. Still, we could, I think, modify the setup to get the same result.) Hence, @B is true at w, in which case, from (U), we have it that B is true at the actual world, that is, that B is true. But B was arbitrary. Hence, triviality follows.

The trouble, in the end, is not that there's no escape from this problem. There is an escape: namely, reject the existence of our 'uniform' actuality operator! The trouble, as mentioned above, is that what makes Priestly noneism attractive is its drive towards accommodating all properties in (CP), rather than ad hocly restricting against various properties. If the alleged 'uniform' notion of actuality is indeed an independently recognized and coherent notion of actuality, then Priestly noneism is forced to perform the very restrictions that it so admirably sought to avoid.

As above, I do not know whether there's strong, independent evidence for the so-called 'uniform' actuality operator. Apart from its triviality-engendering clash with Priestly noneism, the notion seems to make sense, but it may well be that there is independent reason to reject such a notion. Accordingly, I leave the above worry as an open worry.


Let me close by reaffirming my strong recommendation for this book. Priest has given us a clearly presented, novel framework in which to understand the metaphysics and semantics of intentionality. Towards Non-Being is a refreshingly bold attempt to overcome long-standing obstacles to unrestricted characterization of non-existent objects. While philosophers of any area will profit from the book, there are some for whom, arguably, Priest's book is required reading: namely, metaphysicians, philosophers of language, and philosophical logicians.