Tracing Expression in Merleau-Ponty: Aesthetics, Philosophy of Biology, and Ontology

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Véronique Fóti, Tracing Expression in Merleau-Ponty: Aesthetics, Philosophy of Biology, and Ontology, Northwestern University Press, 2013, 170pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810129009.

Reviewed by Scott Marratto, Michigan Technological University


The concept of expression is arguably a key to Merleau-Ponty's whole philosophy. The philosophical problems that preoccupy him, from the late 1930's to the time of his death in 1961 -- how to conceive of mind as essentially incarnate; how to conceive the intertwining of culture and nature in the world of perception; how to think the inscription of ideality and truth within the always-finite terrain of historicity, language and institutions; how, in short, to think being as "flesh" -- all coalesce around what Merleau-Ponty calls the "paradox of expression" (The Visible and the Invisible, 144).

Perhaps not surprisingly, the concept of expression is most clearly explicated and deployed in those writings in which Merleau-Ponty directly concerns himself with the phenomena of art and language. But, in this excellent study, Véronique Fóti reveals the breadth and range of the concept of expression as it functions across a number of topics in Merleau-Ponty's later thought. Indeed, her book shows that we really only appreciate the significance of Merleau-Ponty's concept of expression if we grasp the way in which it operates as a fundamental category, not merely in his aesthetics and philosophy of language, but in his account of nature, his philosophy of biology, and in the notion of institution that he foregrounds in his writings and lecture courses in the 1950's.

Fóti's book is divided into three parts. Part 1 offers an account of Merleau-Ponty's aesthetics, primarily through readings of each of his three major essays on painting. In the first three chapters, she argues that, through his reflections on painting, Merleau-Ponty develops his concept of expression beyond the scope of its initial connection to perception and language (as elaborated in Phenomenology of Perception); over the course of his career he comes to a fuller appreciation of the way in which expression is inscribed within the horizons of historicity and culture.

Merleau-Ponty speaks of expression as a paradox because it is at once a kind of translation (the term expression, derived from the Latin verb exprimare, "to press out," implies something like an outward manifestation of a meaning or intention) and an act of creation. The expressive power of, say, an artwork, can be measured against that which the work seems to be trying to express, but that which the work seeks to express (the expressed) does not preexist the act of expression. There is a kind of peculiar logic of retroactivity in expression -- the work of expression also constitutes that which is expressed in it. Fóti shows how Merleau-Ponty develops this understanding through his assessment of art:

Merleau-Ponty notes that artistic expression is not, as it were, the translation of a thought that is already formed or clarified into the medium of the chosen art. The meaning or sense of the work is not antecedent to its creation, and neither can it be understood on the basis either of an artist's life or of his or her place in the history of art. (19)

They key point here is that expression is the originary upsurge of meaning in the world and is not reducible to anything other than itself, whether that be an idea in the mind of a subject or a physiological impulse.

Notwithstanding his insight into the spontaneity of artistic expression, Fóti argues that Merleau-Ponty never adequately addresses the way in which a strong current of twentieth century art moves toward abstraction, and, further, she questions Merleau-Ponty's claim that the history of painting -- from the cave art of Lascaux to the works of Cézanne, Picasso and Klee -- can be understood as constituting one universal history. She argues that Merleau-Ponty seems to overlook not only the radically different meanings of "art" in different cultural contexts, but also the efforts of some contemporary artists to insist on the singularity of individual works.

Fóti suggests that these limitations in Merleau-Ponty's aesthetics might actually reflect a failure to realize the full potential of the concept of expression that he was developing through the 1950's. As she writes, "The very notion of expression seems to bring with it a differential scope and thus a disunity that Merleau-Ponty does not want to recognize" (31).

Part 2 deals with biology, with particular reference to Merleau-Ponty's Collège de France lecture courses on nature from the late 1950's. She discusses his treatment of issues in the work of the biologists Jakob von Uexküll, Adolf Portmann, and Konrad Lorenz concerning the concept of an organism, the relation of organism and environment, and the nexus of physiology and behavior in phylogeny and ontogeny. In each of these discussions, Fóti compellingly demonstrates that the concept of expression is key to understanding the way in which Merleau-Ponty thinks about fundamental problems in biology.

Particularly fascinating is the extended discussion in which she shows how Merleau-Ponty, deploying the concept of expression, interprets Uexküll's famous concept of Umwelt and, thus, his account of animal life and behavior, in a manner quite different from Martin Heidegger's much-criticized appropriation of the same concepts from Uexküll. Expression, precisely insofar as it functions, on the one hand, in connection with art and language, and, on the other, with animal behavior and development, problematizes, in Merleau-Ponty's thought, the traditional boundaries between human and animal life.

Part 3 deals with expression as a basic concept in the ontology that Merleau-Ponty was explicitly developing in his later work. It consists of two chapters, the first of which considers Merleau-Ponty's engagement with each of the three major figures in the 17th-18 th century rationalist tradition (Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz). Here Fóti compellingly argues that Merleau-Ponty failed to appreciate the way in which Spinoza might have anticipated the logic of expression that he himself was developing. In the final chapter and conclusion, Fóti shows that the logic of expression underpins Merleau-Ponty's ontology of chiasmic flesh, and she also responds, on his behalf, to critics (like Emmanuel Levinas and Luce Irigaray) who think that Merleau-Ponty's ontology of flesh occludes alterity and difference.

In each of the three parts, Fóti offers reflections on broad themes in Merleau-Ponty's texts, foregrounding the development of his concept of expression, indicating what she judges to be limitations in its earliest articulations, and showing how Merleau-Ponty comes to realize the radical implications of his concept of expression in his mature ontology. For the most part this agenda is clear, but in a few places, the thesis concerning the development of the concept of expression gets a little bit obscure, and this at times makes the unity of the various discussions a little difficult to discern.

To be sure, in the Introduction, Fóti notes that the concept of expression, while crucial, is not always explicit in Merleau-Ponty's texts; rather, it is often tied up with other major concepts and themes in his work. Concerning her treatment of the concept in her own book, she thus writes:

The reader should therefore not find it surprising that, in the studies that make up this book, expression is not always at the forefront, or in explicit and constant view, but may at times be at best traced out, to borrow one of Merleau-Ponty's favorite metaphors, in filigree. (5)

 This is indeed the case in some of the book's discussions of its various topics. But from the fact that the concept of expression is only implicit at many points in Merleau-Ponty's writings, it does not follow that it should be only implicit in a systematic study of the concept as it is deployed in his thought. And at times one wishes that the stakes involved in the concept of expression were a bit more clearly foregrounded in Fóti's treatment of the various topics that she considers.

For example, in the first chapter, in which she discusses Merleau-Ponty's 1946 essay, "Cézanne's Doubt," she offers a fairly quick adumbration of the concept of expression as it is developed in the assessment of Cézanne. According to Fóti, Merleau-Ponty treats Cézanne's work as a kind of "proto-phenomenological" investigation of "wild being," or of "perception itself as primordial expression" (20). But, on the basis of her own rich and insightful reflections on Cézanne's painting, and invoking reflections from other commentators and art historians, Fóti points out that Cézanne himself understood his painting as:

"a harmony parallel to nature," a harmony that, particularly in his late paintings, was realized in terms of chromatic scales (the musical metaphor is pertinent) or sequences of unblended patches of color that do not record what the eye sees nor conform to the laws of aerial perspective but that rather constitute an autonomous "réalisation sur nature" (realization on the basis of nature). (20)

The point here is that Cézanne increasingly moved towards a kind of abstraction in his painting and that he understood painting as "a self-contained artistic order of expression" rather than as a proto-phenomenological interrogation of perception as primordial expression. Merleau-Ponty thus, according to Fóti, occludes an important aspect of Cézanne's work and painterly practice.

As I indicated above, in the subsequent chapters of Part 1, Fóti further develops and generalizes this critique of Merleau-Ponty's account of art, particularly his "astonishing" dismissal of abstraction (29). This discussion of painting, including the critical remarks about Merleau-Ponty, is very rich and offers valuable insight into the relation of his aesthetics to his larger project, but the connection to her own book's larger claim about expression is not made as clear as it could be in the opening chapters, and, consequently, some of Fóti's criticisms of Merleau-Ponty come off sounding like criticisms of the very idea of expression.

Thus, at times, one might think that Fóti is trying to show how expression comes to be supplanted, as a fundamental concept, by the idea of institution. For example, she writes,

The move from expression (in the rather undefined sense that this notion has so far carried for Merleau-Ponty) to institution (which, he notes, has so far lacked any name or identity in theories of consciousness) allows him to distance sense or meaning more decisively from positivity. (37)

Later, speaking of Merleau-Ponty's 1960 essay, "Eye and Mind," she writes: "The painter's body in its operative actuality is now, for Merleau-Ponty, not so much the agent of expression as of a transubstantiation that takes place between itself, the world, and the painterly work" (43). These passages imply that expression comes to be superseded by the concept of institution insofar as the latter eschews the earlier philosophy's preoccupation with consciousness, perception, and voluntarist subjectivity.

However, viewed in the context of the book's broader argument, the point seems to be that the earliest versions of expression were simply inadequate insofar as they were too tied to a phenomenology based on the standpoint of the embodied perceiver, and not sufficiently attentive to the decentered, pluralist, historico-cultural horizon within which the work of expression inscribes itself. There are two different theses at work here, and it seems to me that there is occasionally some ambiguity between them. This ambiguity would perhaps have been cleared up somewhat if Fóti had offered a clearer definition of expression and a more direct statement of her own thesis concerning the development of the concept in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy at the outset (the clearest explicit summation of the logic of expression as such occurs in Chapter 7).

These critical remarks notwithstanding, I think Fóti's book is an excellent and illuminating study of the concept of expression in Merleau-Ponty's work. I want to conclude by highlighting one more of its particularly rich discussions. In Chapter 4, Fóti investigates Merleau-Ponty's treatment of a crucial problem in biology: the problem of development. She shows how, in his interpretation of 20th century biology, Merleau-Ponty is keen to discern the logic of the relation of parts and wholes at work in the development of organisms, particularly in terms of the nexus of physiology and behavior. What is at issue here is the question of how organisms manage to develop physiologically and behaviorally in a manner that seems to integrate various developing parts into a totality that is in turn seamlessly geared, throughout the organism's development, to the demands of its environment.

As with a number of issues that Fóti discusses, this one is relevant far beyond the world of Merleau-Ponty scholarship: biology's present preoccupation with genomics reflects a naïve presumption that such problems would be resolved with DNA sequencing. In fact, the science of genomics has only deepened the riddle of development, and the questions that Merleau-Ponty raised, on the basis of his readings of significant figures in 20th century biology, are as relevant now as ever.

Fóti does an admirable job of showing how a biology of expression would address these and other problems. The key is in the idea of expression as the logic of the emergence of meaning -- the development of an organism is not the execution of a developmental plan but the enactment of a kind of interpretation of a vital situation. She cites, in this connection, Uexküll's idea that an organism is like a melody singing itself. Inspired by his readings of Saussure, Merleau-Ponty, she argues, recognizes that meaning always emerges within a differentially structured field. She writes:

"It is not a positive being but an interrogative being that defines life," Merleau-Ponty suggests; and the totality that may surge forth from multiplicity is "the establishment of a certain dimension" in terms of which the organism's surroundings will acquire meaning or, one might say, configure a world. Negation, he now reflects, need not be synonymous with irreality but may be understood as divergence; and life, perhaps, "is only a fold, the reality of a process . . . unobservable up close." (66)

The logic of development is a logic of "differential articulation" in which an organism comes to embody a certain set of potentials afforded by an environment (78).

Through her exploration of expression, Fóti not only highlights the problematic character of the boundary between human and animal life, she raises important questions about the relation of language meaning and biological meaning, and, in attending to the logic of expression, she draws from Merleau-Ponty's lecture courses on nature an outline of the basic principles of a non-reductionist biology.

In the final chapter and conclusion, Fóti offers an account of Merleau-Ponty's ontology of "flesh" that helps to correct some unfortunate misunderstandings -- namely, those that interpret it as a kind of monism. Through her very insightful interpretation of Merleau-Ponty's claim that flesh is to be understood using the concept of "element," she shows that what Merleau-Ponty calls flesh is a field constituted of irreducible multiplicity. Her account of this ontology will be of immense value for any reader trying to come to grips with Merleau-Ponty's later work.

In her Introduction, Fóti notes that the concept of expression has been somewhat neglected in English language scholarship. Though the concept of expression has featured prominently in a number of important articles in English, Fóti's is indeed, so far as I know, among the first book-length treatments of the topic in English. It happens that Donald Landes -- translator of the 2012 Routledge edition of Phenomenology of Perception -- has also just published an excellent monograph on the subject: Merleau-Ponty on the Paradoxes of Expression (Bloomsbury, 2013). While Landes grapples with some of the same issues regarding aesthetics and ontology, Fóti's book is unique for its exploration of the logic of expression in its particular application to biology. It will be indispensible for anyone seeking to register the full significance of Merleau-Ponty's concept of expression and its potential relevance for, among other things, aesthetics, philosophy of biology, and environmental philosophy.