Tragedy in Hegel's Early Theological Writings

Placeholder book cover

Peter Wake, Tragedy in Hegel's Early Theological Writings, Indiana University Press, 2014, 256pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253012517.

Reviewed by Robert R. Williams, University of Illinois at Chicago (Emeritus)


Another look at Hegel's unpublished Early Theological Writings! Is there anything important that has been left unexamined in these materials? Indeed there is. Wake's focus is on tragedy, a topic conspicuous by its absence in Richard Kroner's otherwise useful introduction to these materials. Tragedy was always interesting to Hegel, and he wrote about it in his 1807 Phenomenology and Lectures on Aesthetics. While there are tragic elements in the ETW -- notably Macbeth's fate and a "Banquo's ghost" theory of retributive punishment -- tragedy is not a topic that has been explored as a unifying theme in the ETW.

Wilhelm Dilthey considered the ETW not as Hegel's final views, but nevertheless some of his best writing. In the essay on the "Positivity of the Christian Religion," Hegel writes as a Kantian upholding autonomy and the divinity of morality and criticizing the heteronomy and authoritarianism into which institutional Christian religion had declined, earning the scathing criticism of "superstition, deception and stupidity." Hegel observes that positivity is a condition that can befall any doctrine, precept or idea, and that requires it to be enforced by external means and by authority. The question is not whether Christian religion contains positive elements, but whether it is positive as a whole. In the second essay, "The Spirit of Christianity and its Fate" (SC) there is a serious shift in attitude and orientation. Hegel is now a critic of Kantian morality with its abstract universal law and imperative before which individuals stand condemned. Hegel transformed himself from a critic of institutional religion, a fossilized positive Christianity in particular, to a defender of the spirit of Christianity as a religion of love, freedom and reconciliation, all synthesized in the aesthetic category of beauty, because beauty not only overcomes the oppositions and dualisms of reason and sensibility, but also overcomes the oppositions of struggle and coercion. Beauty is thus both psychologically and intersubjectively liberating.

Peter Wake's book is a "wake-up call" that summons us to another look at this material, because his reading emphasizes the continuity between the two essays, and the continuity is thematically developed around the concept of tragedy. According to Wake, tragedy plays an important role in Hegel's early writings on theology and politics. Hegel's overarching aim in these texts is to determine the kind of mythology that would best complement religious and political freedom in modernity. Wake claims that, for Hegel at this early stage, ancient Greek tragedy provided the model for such a mythology. Tragedy suggested a way to oppose the rigid dichotomies that characterized the philosophy, the hierarchies and authoritarianism of the Europe of his day. Tragedy also suggests a criticism of Kant's moral vision of the world and its moral God, which Hegel criticizes as dissembling bad faith in the Phenomenology.

The conclusion of Wake's investigation and analysis of the tragic model of a new mythology for modernity is negative. Wake believes that Hegel follows Hölderlin in repudiating the ancient Greek tragedy as a model for a religio-cultural renewal in modernity, because the world-view of ancient Greek tragedies cannot be renewed or replicated in modern European culture. This is not because modernity has somehow abolished tragedy, but rather because contemporary experience is shaped by an even deeper sense of alienation and loss than that reflected in tragic experience, the dissolution of the tragic hero, etc. This includes modern cultural fragmentation, disintegration and the necessity of enduring atomism and separation. Such disintegration includes the failure of thought to unite with the infinite, and this failure is part of the 'authentic' modern experience of tragedy (if anything can be authentic under such assumptions). This implies that modernity is marked by the return of the final form of tragedy in Hegel's Phenomenology, one which undermines the possibility of tragedy, to wit, the unhappy consciousness. For Hegel the utterance of the unhappy consciousness that God is dead expresses the loss of everything substantial, i.e., the erosion if not the loss of precisely those conditions and institutions necessary for serious tragic conflict in the first place. Stated otherwise, tragedy is more "optimistic" than the unhappy consciousness precisely because tragedy takes ethical life and its substance seriously, whereas the unhappy consciousness mourns the loss of everything substantial.

Wake's analysis consists in a close reading of ETW and recent scholarship. It is too detailed to summarize. However his analysis helps to convey the complexity of Hegel's own analyses that resulted in these dense, multi-leveled works. In these essays Hegel has not yet arrived at his own position, and he refused to carry out his own education in public. I shall identify some topics, questions and reservations about Wake's book, which deserves to be read precisely because it shakes matters up.

What is tragedy?

A first concern/question is, what exactly does Wake mean by tragedy? He does not mention Aristotle's definition of the genre. Hegel famously identifies tragedy as a conflict of right against right within an established order of ethical life. Institutions like families and the state are not inherently incompatible or in conflict, but come into conflict through the contingent actions of tragic heroes who one-sidedly identify with one ethical power and oppose it to the rest. Such conflict threatens the entire ethical order and may call for the destruction of the hero as the price of avoiding complete catastrophe. Surprisingly Wake does not mention Hegel's well-known differentiation of tragedy as a conflict of right against right, from the moral conflict of right versus wrong.

Wake cites Peter Szondi on Schelling's speculative theory of tragedy illustrated by Oedipus. (87-88), to wit, tragedy is a contradiction between fate and freedom. The contradiction requires the dissolution/destruction of the tragic hero, Oedipus. But this is too formal, and obscures rather than clarifies the relation between fate and freedom that Schelling explores. Tragedy involves a heroic conception of freedom. What makes Oedipus heroic is that he tries everything possible to prevent the oracle about him from coming true and is subjectively innocent of parricide; however when he finally recognizes that he has blindly and mistakenly murdered his father and married his mother, he nevertheless accepts his fate and assumes full responsibility for his actions.

Wake believes that Hegel interprets Jesus as a tragic hero, but in a quite different sense than Oedipus, modeled on the beautiful soul. It is difficult to picture this negative withdrawn figure as heroic, much less a tragic hero. Wake owes his readers some indication of a general concept of tragedy and tragic hero that might embrace both Oedipus who acts, and Jesus as beautiful soul who does not act. Oedipus is heroic, but not necessarily beautiful, while Jesus as beautiful soul is a 'non-heroic hero' because he does not act -- he withdraws.

Positivity and the Problem of objectification

The issue Hegel addresses in ETW is the creation of a new mythology and form of institutionalization that avoids or overcomes positivity. But the negative conclusion of Wake's analysis comes close to identifying the problem of positivity as a necessary, inevitable by-product of the objectification necessary for actualization and institutionalization. In short, the objectification necessary for freedom to become actual in the world entails positivity, heteronomy, and alienation.

According to Wake this problem is compounded by love as the Christian principle. The limits of Christian tragedy are the limits of love. In love there is no room for objectivity; love tends to isolate, and its attempts to objectify itself beyond transient acts of fulfillment fail. (176) Like the beautiful soul, love is essentially shaped in Wake's reading as withdrawal; consequently love cannot achieve objectivity and thus fails to become actual. It is incomplete. (SC 253)

Wake plausibly asserts that if love is not permitted to become actual in life, love is insufficient to form the basis of a community and remains confined to the private sphere. Given this metaphysical failure of love to achieve objectivity, the Christian community had to recognize itself not merely as love pure and simple, but also in a factual reality, whether proselytizing/expansion (the sole activity that is allowed as an exception to withdrawal from world), or a positive doctrine/teaching (ETW 294), to wit, a doctrine about the common master and teacher. The remarkable thing about the spirit of the community is that, in its eyes, the divine, its unifying principle, has the form of something given. (ETW 294) In the history of Christianity there is an ambiguity; on the one hand it is constituted by the consciousness of love as reconciliation and freedom but confined to the private sphere, and on the other, by the consciousness of a dependence on and discipleship to a lord and master. Since love excludes objectivity and actuality, the latter view of lordship and mastery eventually becomes dominant and the positivity of Christianity is the result. Objectivity per se remains a fate, for it is the opposite of subjectivity (W 199). It is in this sense that Wake interprets and understands the fate of Christianity. Positivity results not from a subjective orientation to its content, but rather from the content of Christianity itself.

Jesus as beautiful soul

According to Wake, "For Hegel the withdrawal characterizing . . . beauty of the soul is an essential aspect of the figure of Jesus, and the fate of the beautiful soul is that of Christianity in general." (169) This assertion does not refer to the "Positivity" essay, but to the "Spirit of Christianity and its Fate." It appears as Wake's answer to Hegel's question, whether Christianity is inherently positive; if it is, then it is unsalvageable. However in the Spirit essay, Hegel is supposedly making the opposite point and distinguishing Christianity from its positive forms.

To portray Jesus as tragic hero, Wake asserts that Hegel conceives him as a beautiful soul. A beautiful soul does not act, but rather seeks to preserve its beauty by withdrawal from the world, and achieves only an isolated impotent individuality. Like a beautiful soul, Jesus refuses to sacrifice his own beauty, and instead withdraws; his freedom is the purely negative freedom of the void. (190) Jesus may be essentially about reconciliation, but the reconciliation will never live in his action. (191) According to Wake, Jesus' withdrawal from the world, fate of his people, etc., renders the idea of love empty and abstract. This emptying of love, its reduction to or dependence on an abstract principle that requires external means of enforcing it, is the fate of the spirit of Christianity: to wit, positivity emerges at the core of the Christian movement, and this positivity is the consequence of Jesus' life and teaching. (195) Hence positivity results not merely from a contingent orientation to its content, but rather from the content of Christianity itself. The attempt to avoid fate is the highest fate, i.e., the self-subversion, of Christianity and love.

Wake's reading of ETW is powerful, but it rests on a narrow reading of Jesus as a morbid beautiful soul implausibly identified as a tragic hero, and ignores entirely Hegel's philosophy of love and reconciliation in the second part of SC. As Walter Jaeschke has pointed out, Hegel is both critic of the positivity of the Christian religion, and defender of Christianity as religion of love, freedom and reconciliation. Wake's analyses of ETW yield a picture of Hegel as critic of positivity and ossified Christianity. That is the strength of his book. But there is scarcely any acknowledgement that in the second essay Hegel also arrives at a reassessment of Christianity that differentiates it as a religion of freedom, love and reconciliation, from its heteronomous positive forms. Tragedy has a role to play in this differentiation, for it implies a shift from the abstract transcendence of classical metaphysics -- including Kant's postulate of the God of morality as a spiritual master/slave -- to the immanence of life and vital processes, including freedom and love.

 Hegel's reassessment means that Jesus cannot be treated simply as tragic hero through the negative concepts of withdrawal and beautiful soul, who, in pursuing his own beauty by withdrawal from the world, never acts and never becomes actual. To be sure, the negative concept of beautiful soul does culminate in a self-subverting negative freedom of the void. This is how Hegel portrays it in the Phenomenology: the beautiful soul is a good conscience that becomes hollowed out and declines into evil. The decline of conscience into evil is also a theme of the Philosophy of Right (§139). But Hegel does not identify Jesus with the negative or morbid beautiful soul in his published writings or Lectures.

On the contrary, Hegel distinguishes between a morbid beautiful soul that does not act and, as an impotent individual, pursues his own purity and wastes away, and a truly beautiful soul that acts and is actual. The truly beautiful soul grasps the affirmative possibilities present in beauty, to wit, an opening to the world and to others as affirmative conditions and sources of freedom. According to Schiller beauty is a second creator of humanity. As such, it opens up the possibility of ethical life. Freedom for Hegel is being at home with self in one's other. That is, freedom is inseparable from love, and in SC Hegel adumbrates a philosophy of love that, as Dieter Henrich has shown, is the germ of and impetus to his later systematic development, in which love undergoes transformation and sublation into life, recognition, and spirit. Love is more than abstract benevolence and altruism; rather, love suspends narrow individual subjectivity, egoistic self-seeking, and affirms the other in her own right and in her freedom. Love does not seek to subdue the other, or to impose its own agenda; rather love renounces coercion, mastery and domination. But this renunciation of coercion is the opposite of withdrawal from others and world, because love not merely affirms the other, it acts for the other's good. Love's affirmation of other signifies the ethical priority of the other over the self. For the sake of the other, love is willing to sacrifice the inner purity that the morbid beautiful soul sought to preserve by fleeing the world. This implies a quasi-heroic conception of Jesus as beautiful soul.

For Hegel love is not reducible to mere emotion or empty subjectivity, as Wake claims. Rather love is so fundamentally intersubjective that Hegel dismisses self-love as a meaningless, narcissistic concept precisely because it lacks serious otherness (ETW 247). Without serious otherness and difference, love would have nothing to love or reconcile. Similarly, love transcends and sublates the juridical and moral standpoints. As such it is a religious-theological conception rather than a moral or political one. As Hannah Arendt shows in The Human Condition, love in the determinate shape of forgiveness has important political implications, because it makes possible a new beginning.

The distinguishing feature of love is reconcilability (Versöhnlichkeit). In reconciliation the injured party does not insist upon its rights or upon justice. It abstracts from and divests itself of these. In not insisting upon one's rights, the spirit of reconcilability makes an affirmative use of negative freedom. Here the point is not to flee from relationship as 'impure,' or as 'contamination,' but rather to sustain, repair the rupture of relation and transform the relationship. These are the actions of the genuine beautiful soul who acts and becomes actual. Consequently, to say that "Love has conquered does not mean the same as 'duty has conquered', i.e., subdued its enemies; it means that love has overcome hostility." (ETW 247) By giving up its right, as its hostile fate, to the evil genius of the other, the heart reconciles itself with him, and thereby has won just so much life as was hostile to it . . . and the fate it had aroused against itself by its own deed has dissolved into the airs of night." Reconciling love, in renouncing its right of justified retribution it has acquired against an offender, does no injury to life in itself and avoids the fate it would have acquired in acting justly and retributively, repaying an eye for an eye, etc. But the inhibition and refraining from retribution is still action; it is not impotence but heroic ethical-spiritual power. It is in this heroic sense that love reconciles fate, not in a withdrawal from fate that subverts itself into the highest fate. The latter fate is trapped in a self-perpetuating spurious infinity. According to Hegel love breaks the might of objectivity and upsets this whole sphere. (ETW 247) Love gives rise to Hegel's mature position on objectivity, which is dialectical: objectivity is both the opposite of subjectivity, and its free realization. In reconciliation lies love's mutuality and social-religious infinity.

To be sure, Hegel had not yet arrived at his mature philosophical-conceptual position in ETW. He was still influenced on the positivity issue by classical metaphysics, which presupposes abstract transcendence, abstract universals, and undifferentiated identity, all of which add up to the spurious infinite in theory and mastery and slavery in practice. The problem is that love, although infinite, is in the ETW still conceived through the abstract universal, as a term limited and restricted by opposition, or worse, as negative freedom and withdrawal. But an infinite that must withdraw from the finite is itself finite. The problem of the ETW is not with Hegel's concept of love. Rather it is in Hegel's metaphysics -- the vision of asymmetrical abstract transcendence in terms of which freedom and love are formulated as negative, withdrawal, abstract and indeterminate -- a metaphysics that lacks adequate concepts of freedom, relation and community. Despite his differentiation of the spirit of Christianity from its positive forms, and retrieval of it as a religion of love and freedom, the young Hegel still remained intellectually stuck in spurious infinites (ETW 300-301). As Hegel discovered, love in his sense requires a new metaphysics of relation and social infinity. Love mediates and reconciles opposition and makes possible the maintenance and repair of vital relations in reconciliation so that the tragic, self-inflicted wounds of spirit can heal. However the tragic aspect of love remains even within its inclusive totality and social infinity.

Hegel's philosophy of love has historically been one of the main reasons why scholars have bothered with the ETW -- precisely because it anticipates and foreshadows some main concepts of Hegel's mature philosophy. Wake's book slights this material and concludes that Christianity in ETW is a failed tragedy. His procedure of beginning with the third part of the SC and reading it backwards helps him frame the entire essay in terms of the concept of withdrawal: Jesus as tragic hero, morbid beautiful soul, tragic fate, etc. But this frame, retrospectively imposed, unduly narrows his perspective, and holds fast to abstract universality and negative freedom, so that the removal from fate is the highest fate of love.

Wake's book is provocative and helpful because it sharpens appreciation of the complexity of the material in the ETW; it brings into focus tensions and contradictions in the texts. It contributes to the recognition of the subtlety and enduring importance of this early work. I agree with Wake that tragedy is an important dimension of Hegel's thought. While Hegel may have abandoned the ETW, he did not abandon the concept of tragedy, nor did he exclude tragedy from Christianity, as did the theological-metaphysical tradition. Hegel's concept of the death of God is a tragic conception, implying suffering and negativity in God. Tragic implications are inherent in the declaration that "reason is the rose in the cross of the present" in the Philosophy of Right. Tragic conflicts, while always possible, are counterbalanced by the possibility of reconciliation. However, reconciliation for Hegel is no conflict-free harmony but rather "a disquieted bliss in disaster" (eine unglückselige Seligkeit im Unglück).

In SC, Hegel had not yet arrived at his mature concept of the true infinite, the differentiation of love into immediacy (as principle of the family) and mediation (civil society and state), and religion, and his threefold differentiation of spirit into subjective, objective and absolute. His system explodes the limited quasi-Kantian philosophical and theological conceptuality of the ETW. Hegel's project may have started with the ETW, but that was only the beginning, and he never returned to these early works or sought their publication. He had made the discovery that "truth is in a fine mess when all metaphysics and philosophy are mere things of the past, and the only philosophy that counts is no philosophy at all." (LHP 3, 476-77)