Transcendence and The Concrete: Selected Writings

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Jean Wahl, Transcendence and The Concrete: Selected Writings, Alan D. Schrift and Ian Alexander Moore (eds.), Fordham University Press, 2017, 291pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823273027.

Reviewed by Sean Bowden, Deakin University


Prior to the publication of this volume, and apart from William Hackett's recent translation of Human Existence and Transcendence (Notre Dame 2016), there existed only a small number of Jean Wahl's works in English. A handful of essays and a monograph, The Philosopher's Way (1948), were written and published in English in the 1940s -- penned during Wahl's wartime exile in the US. Several French essays and books can also be found scattered here and there in English translation, albeit in editions long out of print, such as the Pluralist Philosophies of England and America (1925), A Short History of Existentialism (1949) and Philosophies of Existence (1968). Finally, the keen researcher will be able to track down a little of Wahl's poetry, some of which was originally written and published in English, and some in the form of partial translations of French works.

The relative obscurity of Wahl's work in the English-speaking world, however, stands in stark contrast to his recognition in France as a leading light in 20th century French intellectual life. As Levinas once wrote, testifying both to Wahl's philosophical and institutional status and to the novelty of his thought, Wahl was 'the life force of the academic, extra-academic and even, to a degree, anti-academic philosophy necessary to a great culture' (1).[1] Or, again, as Deleuze claimed, 'in everything that was important before and after the war, there are signs of Jean Wahl' (17)[2] and 'apart from Sartre . . . [he was] the most important philosopher in France' (15).[3] As for Sartre himself, he was full of praise for Wahl's 1932 Vers le concret (15-16).[4] The great value of this anthology, then, lies in the way it illuminates for us the work and evident influence of this important philosopher.

The collection is prefaced by an introduction to Wahl's rather remarkable life, thought and impact. The extensive and meticulously referenced research undertaken by Moore and Schrift in order to bring us their portrait of Wahl is noteworthy, and makes their introduction a valuable resource. Wahl's writings in this volume are bookended by two pieces which summarize the key elements of his philosophical thought and concerns. The first is the 'Preface to Toward the Concrete', which appeared in 1932; the second, 'Experience and Transcendence; or, An Ontological Journey', was initially published in 1957 and partially republished in 1963. Between them, we find a selection of Wahl's essays, book chapters, lectures, conference papers and occasional pieces, as well as two discussions of Wahl's work involving a number of his contemporaries: the partly oral, partly epistolary discussion of Wahl's famous 1937 lecture, 'Subjectivity and Transcendence' (also included); and the much shorter discussion which follows Wahl's paper on Nietzsche for the 1964 conference at Royaumont Abbey. In all cases, the anthology's team of specialist translators have done an admirable job of retaining the clarity of Wahl's prose while carefully noting departures from the standard translations of the non-English language works that Wahl examines. Moreover, each translation is prefaced by a brief but helpful introduction which establishes the context for that text's initial appearance, as well as its subsequent history and influence.

As the reader will quickly divine, much of Wahl's work tends to be about the thought of others: philosophers primarily but also certain poets, the link between poetry and metaphysics being one of Wahl's major concerns (see, in this volume, 'Poetry and Metaphysics'). A brief glance at the table of contents reveals Wahl's particular preoccupation with the work of Hegel, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Jaspers and Heidegger. Indeed, it is for his ground-breaking studies of these particular thinkers that he is most famous in France. But even those texts in which Wahl appears to speak in his own name, such as those singled out by title in the previous paragraph, are littered with references to and meditations upon the works of Léon Brunschvicg, Hénri Bergson, William James, Gabriel Marcel and A.N. Whitehead, among others. And when we also read in the bibliography of Wahl's principal texts that, as a young philosopher, he published book-length studies of Plato, Descartes and Anglo-American pluralism, we can readily appreciate why Wahl is regarded as one of the most influential French interpreters, not only of contemporary philosophical movements such as phenomenology, existentialism, American pragmatism and British empiricism (2), but of ancient and modern philosophy as well.

But Wahl is more than simply an interpreter of the history of philosophy. His exploration of the works of others is, in fact, his primary method for advancing his own philosophical views. His colleague, Ferdinand Alquié, once described Wahl's method as a kind of 'pointillism', or a 'method of juxtaposition', whereby he presents his own thought through the constant 'adjunction' of reflections on the thoughts of others, each of which comes to enrich and correct the overall position.[5] From one end of this anthology to another, we thus find Wahl simultaneously engaged both in sympathetic and nuanced readings of various aspects of the philosophies of Hegel, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Jaspers and Heidegger, and in the indirect presentation of his own concerns with concrete experience, the simultaneous transcendence and immanence of thought in relation to the concrete, and the inevitability of an existential dialectic brought about by thought's confrontation with the concrete. I will focus primarily on elucidating these three elements of Wahl's 'philosophy of the concrete', leaving it to the interested reader to engage with the influential studies of phenomenological and early existentialist thought in this collection.

Wahl's philosophy of the concrete is best understood in relation to the problems it takes itself to be a response to. From the opening paragraph of the 'Preface to Toward the Concrete', Wahl takes aim at idealism: firstly Hegelian idealism, but eventually also the epistemological idealism of some of his contemporaries, primarily Léon Brunschvicg. For Wahl, Hegel makes the concrete the most impoverished of concepts. In the 'Sense Certainty' chapter of The Phenomenology of Spirit, we can recall, Hegel argues that what empiricists take to be the most concrete reality -- that which is designated by the words 'I', 'here', 'now', 'mine', etc. -- turns out to be the most abstract. This is because, when the words we use to designate this reality -- 'I', here', 'now', 'mine', etc. -- are used by others, or by myself at another time, they refer to other things. As Wahl argues, however, what is revealed here is not so much the poverty of the concrete, but the impotence of language -- its inability to grasp the concrete. Here, 'language, far from revealing the real, reveals itself, but as powerless' (34).

The concrete, for Wahl, has a reality of its own, outside of the work of the intelligence, and it is toward this reality that our thought, language and science are directed. He thus affirms 'a certain realism' (264), and his wish, contrary to the idealistic tendencies of his contemporaries, was to give back to the immediate its value and its role in thought, and to help us understand better the point of departure for reflection. However, it should immediately be emphasized that Wahl's concrete is not 'atomic', as the British empiricists would have it. For Wahl, these empiricists' notion of the element or atom of experience -- the sense-data or objects that we are directly aware of in perception -- is just as abstract as the Idealist's whole. He argues that the atom or element of experience is, as it were, carved out from a complex situation -- a situation which can never be reconstituted by the juxtaposition of such elements through the synthetic activity of the mind. For Wahl, the elements of experience are themselves concrete particulars, defined by their contingent and actual interrelations with other beings, rather than isolated atoms of sense-data. Or, as Wahl puts it in the 'Preface to Toward the Concrete', the empiricism that he valorizes can be considered an empiricism of atomic forms, but only as long as we understand by this atomism an atomism of complex and thick 'configurations' -- configurations that an artificial division into discrete elements disfigures. What the empiricists in whom Wahl is interested -- especially Bergson, James and Whitehead -- take to be grasped in experience are blocks of duration, spatial volumes, events which interpenetrate one another, generalities understood as felt relations, syntheses without the synthetic activity of the mind, particulars taken as totalities, etc. (37-38, also 257-58 and 259-60).

Finally -- and this is the last problem in light of which Wahl's work should be read -- we can note that Wahl is an opponent of what he calls, following Whitehead, the Cartesian bifurcation, which illegitimately takes us to be separated from the concrete. For Wahl, thought is, in some sense, immanent to the real. At the same time, however, Wahl will also claim that the real can only appear to the thought that attempts to grasp it as something transcending thought (40). The concrete is a single reality, without bifurcation, but the mind can know this reality only by opposing it to itself. In other words, thought's relation to the concrete involves both immanence and transcendence. 'Transcendence is the idea of a beyond by means of which knowledge has a direction, toward which it directs itself, from which it draws its nourishment. Immanence is the idea of this compact density in which no element is absolutely transcendent in relation to any other' (40). Our existence, then, is both fusion with the world and distance from the world (267), and 'the world presents itself first of all as something external, to which we are, so to speak, internal' (264).

But we should also note that, for Wahl, the relation of transcendence that characterises our relation to the concrete has two directions (267). We move toward the concrete as toward something external that transcends thought, but this very movement is itself an internal transcendence: thought's going beyond itself (268). In 'Subjectivity and Transcendence', Wahl likewise speaks of a 'trans-descendance' and a 'trans-ascendance' (157): a trans-descendance toward the concrete which is 'below' thought, but, at the same time, a trans-ascendance in which thought takes the concrete as a kind of 'paradise lost' that one can only attempt to regain by thought's self-transcendence -- in the ecstasy of poetry or, arguably, in the ongoing metamorphosis of philosophical conceptions that Wahl valorizes (258).

Finally, for Wahl, this movement between the below and the beyond -- or as he also puts it, between two kinds of silences (the silence of felt experience 'below' thought and the silence of ecstasy 'beyond' thought) -- is defined by a dialectic (271). Evidently, this won't be a Hegelian dialectic through which Spirit returns to itself by overcoming the series of contradictions it discovered when it initially sought the truth outside of itself (or in sense-certainty). It is rather a dialectic that, according to Wahl, maintains the tension between the opposing terms of which it is comprised (51-52, 266). This dialectic initially takes shape with thought's encounter with the ineffable real -- an encounter that gives rise to contradictory ideas, sometimes for a single thinker, sometimes for several different thinkers within a philosophical movement or period in the history of philosophy.

What are these ideas? Wahl works with a number of them, always depending on the particular philosophical figures, movements and periods he is considering: immanence and transcendence, being and knowledge, internal and external relations, the one and the many, the whole and the parts, continuity and discontinuity, the finite and the infinite, terms and relations, etc. (49-50, 266-67). To put it in the terms of Wahl's two transcendences, the emergence of contradictory ideas in philosophy results from the thought's confrontation with the trans-descendent concrete in all its thickness and ineffability. But at the same time, it is through the tense oscillation of these contradictory ideas that philosophy attempts to trans-ascend itself in order to re-arrive at its point of departure. As he puts it, the 'succession of battling ideas is explained by what is below them, by this non-relational ground which [these contradictory ideas] try to make explicit but which will always preserve its implicit character' (50). Wahl's conception of the dialectic thus entails realism, albeit a realism conceived 'not as a doctrine but as an effort . . . The concrete will never be something given to the philosopher. It will [always] be what is being pursued . . . The real is the limit of the dialectic; the real is its origin; the real is its end, its explanation and its destruction' (51).

So, as in the title of Wahl's Toward the Concrete, the Preface to which many of us will be grateful to now have in English, the 'toward' needs to be emphasized just as much as the 'concrete.' The concrete -- the real -- cannot be separated from the dialectical path that it engenders and that philosophical thinking travels on in its very attempt to pass beyond it. Moreover, Wahl is at pains to emphasise that a plurality of dialectical paths must be taken in order to approach the concrete in an adequate philosophical fashion. Indeed, in the very method he uses -- the pluralist and 'pointillist' method of 'juxtaposition' -- Wahl demonstrates that philosophy's path to the concrete must, if it is to be adequate to its point of departure and arrival, involve taking many such paths. And it is Wahl's novel and influential exploration of a number of such paths -- those taken and lived by Kierkegaard and Nietzsche, but also those traced by Hegel's 'unhappy consciousness' and Heidegger's and Jaspers' phenomenological and existential reflections -- that this splendid and welcome anthology gives us in English for the first time.

[1] Levinas, Emmanuel, Outside the Subject (Stanford University Press, 1993), p. 67.

[2] Deleuze, cited in Dosse, François, Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari: Intersecting Lives, trans. Deborah Glassman (Columbia University Press, 2010), p. 110.

[3] Deleuze, Gilles, 'On the Superiority of Anglo-American Literature,' in Gilles Deleuze and Claire Parnet, Dialogues II, re. ed., trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam (Columbia University Press, 2007), pp. 57-58).

[4] Sartre, Jean-Paul, Search for a Method, trans. Hazel E. Barnes (Vintage, 1968), p. 19.

[5] See Alquié, Ferdinand, 'Jean Wahl et la philosophie,' Critique 10 (1954), pp. 519-521; and 'Jean Wahl', Les Études philosophiques 1 (1975), p. 81.