Transcendental Ontology: Essays in German Idealism

Placeholder book cover

Markus Gabriel, Transcendental Ontology: Essays in German Idealism, Bloomsbury, 2013, $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780567057808.

Reviewed by Sebastian Gardner, University College London


The great number of themes treated, the sheer extent of the territory covered by Fichte, Schelling and Hegel, and the intricacy of the relations that they posit between different fields of philosophical reflection, make it extremely hard to characterize the project of German Idealism, if indeed there is such a unitary thing, in any meaningful overall and synoptic way that does not simply redeploy the German Idealists' own rhetoric (''determination of the absolute in a system of subject-object identity'', etc.). The approach which recommends itself accordingly is that of following out the historical development of German Idealism from Kant, identifying the points where Kant's own concepts are revised and extra-Kantian resources, such as Spinozism, are recruited to the end of providing deeper and more satisfying solutions to Kant's own problems and to the new problems that those solutions in their turn generate. Eckart Förster's The Twenty-Five Years of Philosophy is the most recent major contribution to take this genetic-historical path.1

Markus Gabriel has a view of the overall sense of German Idealism that prescinds from, though it by no means loses touch with, the historical narrative.Transcendental Ontology, though a relatively short book, contains Gabriel's most comprehensive presentation to date, in English, of his reading of German Idealism, and of his endeavour to show its importance not just for philosophy as it is done in the Continental European tradition but for philosophy tout court. Gabriel's view is original and of extremely high interest. Immediately striking are the following features. Kant is regarded by Gabriel as, of course, vital for German Idealism at a formative level, but not as strictly essential for explicating its completed sense. The same goes for Fichte, prior to his 1804 Wissenschaftslehre. The real heart of the German Idealist development lies, in the initial instance, in the formulation of absolute idealism, the breakthrough originally visible in theKritisches Journal der Philosophie essays and other epochal Schelling-Hegel texts of 1801-02. Contemporary Hegelians might warm to this, but they will not like Gabriel's further contention that it is not Hegel but rather Schelling, in his elaborations and revisions of his earlier rationalistic position in the decades following his abandonment of his Identity Philosophy, who ultimately sees furthest -- a conclusion that some other commentators have also reached but which remains a minority view. The real achievement of German Idealism on Gabriel's construal has to do, furthermore, with the foundations of epistemology and metaphysics and their interrelation, and the metaphilosophical perspective which brings it to light is removed from the themes of autonomy, recognition, sociality of reason, and negotiation of the distinction of spirit from nature, which have been prominent in the recent anglophone Hegel renaissance.

Transcendental Ontology contains three large chapters, each divided into sections that address relatively distinct topics and can to some extent be read independently of one another, preceded by an Introduction which states Gabriel's general theses and locates his position on the contemporary landscape. The currently much discussed positions on which Gabriel brings his Schelling-Hegel standpoint to bear are, on the one side, the ''contemporary Anglo-American transcendental epistemology'' of Robert Pippin, John McDowell and Robert Brandom, and on the other, the recent French return to first-order ontology of Alain Badiou and Quentin Meillassoux (viii-ix). While this two-sided engagement helps to bring out the breadth and ambition of Gabriel's project, and his reasons for selecting these targets are clear, the decision to pitch the enquiry in this way carries a disadvantage insofar as Gabriel could hardly be expected to get us up to speed on all these interlocutors, with the result that one has at times the impression of picking up on a conversation already underway. More generally, due to its compression of a wealth of ideas into such a short space, the book demands quite a lot from its readers.2

What emerges from the Introduction, and is amplified in the first chapter, is the direct connection Gabriel envisages of skepticism with ontology. Gabriel's position is helpfully viewed in terms of a contrast with the standard, widely endorsed view of the Copernican revolution as comprising a distinctive and deepened epistemological turn. Very roughly and briefly, Kant is standardly viewed (first) as coming to see, thanks to Hume, that the common weakness of early modern philosophies is due to their shared assumption that ontological claims are required if knowledge claims are to be validated, leading them into ontological commitments which cannot be redeemed without begging the question against the skeptic; and (second) as then offering a way out of this impasse by showing that transcendental argumentation, which turns on skeptically unimpeachable subjective necessities, avoids ontological commitment and thus the dogmatism on which the skeptic feeds. The partial epistemological turn of Descartes is thus completed in Kant: what stops us spinning in the skeptical void is a complex thesis about how we must represent things, in place of fragile conjectures about how things are.

Now not every commentator, perhaps only a very few, will want to say that Kant's idealist successors continue in exactly this vein, that is, will deny that Fichte, Schelling and Hegel, in the course of expanding and correcting Kantian philosophy, accrue at least some new ontological commitments. But typically they will view these as ancillary, and will regard progressive interpretation of German Idealism as minimalizing or qualifying its ontological commitments, on pain of a return to pre-Critical metaphysics. This generalization seems safe at least with regard to current Anglophone commentary on German Idealism. Hence, to refer to one issue now much debated, that of ''metaphysical vs. non-metaphysical'' readings of Hegel, there is a high level of agreement on both sides that platonicity and plausibility are in inverse proportion: a positive evaluation of Hegel's idealism by contemporary lights requires that the attribution of agency to concepts be expunged from its real content, and if Hegelian idealism cannot be de-neoplatonized, then it is to that extent of historical rather than philosophical interest. Again, the German Idealist who explicitly advances constitutive reinterpretations of Kantian regulative claims, namely Schelling, is typically pictured as following a trajectory aslant from the central Fichte-Hegel axis, such that ''absolute idealism'' amounts to something very different in Schelling from in Hegel. To this extent, Kant's anti-metaphysical turn prevails in the interpretation of German Idealism.

Gabriel's counter-claim is that when the full force of the skeptical challenge is appreciated -- which requires a focus on ancient rather than modern forms of skepticism -- we are launched directly into ontological enquiry, and that this is the first, crucial lesson to be learnt from Schelling and Hegel circa 1801-02. The type of reflection compelled by skepticism is, according to Gabriel, not ontological rather than transcendental: it is ontological because it is transcendental. There are two steps to Gabriel's argument for this claim.

First, Gabriel holds that what is exposed by skepticism, carried to the point of completion, is the fundamental shape of cognition, the underlying structure of the situation in which we take ourselves to have thoughts of how things are, made true by how things are independently of our so thinking them. Skepticism is essential for this insight; nothing else can make it available for philosophical reflection. It exhibits the structure of cognition in a negative form -- in the medium of doubt, as a system of negations of knowledge claims. Specifically what it allows us to see is that objective cognition is finite, meaning not that it is restricted in scope, i.e., that the objects to which we have access are limited in quantity and quality, but that it derives its constitution, its internal articulation, from its finitude. The skeptic will of course not welcome this extraction of a positive meta-cognition from her destructive labour, and she can avoid putting her name to it by refusing to participate in or even acknowledge our meta-cognitive project, but she cannot block it, and we beg no questions by identifying in skeptical praxis a distinctive discursive system (with its own rules and objectives) which we may proceed to theorize as we see fit.

Second, having attained this familiarly Kantian, transcendental level of reflection, our next step should be, not to hurry back down to first-order cognition in an attempt to repair it -- which is what Kant does, attempting to re-legitimate objective cognition by reducing its target to a mere Vorstellungswelt -- but instead to focus on the fact that, finding ourselves in the position of reflecting on (putative, first-order) cognition, we are once again confronted with a field of objects to which we refer (viz. our would-be objective cognitions) and to which we accord being, as we also and equally do to the subject of cognition (xi). We have not, therefore, contra the standard epistemological reading of the Copernican revolution, exchanged ontological issues for purely normative, ontologically indifferent concerns; questions of existence have not given way to questions of pure justification.

Another way of putting the point is to say that, rather than leaving until last the question of what makes the results of transcendental logic true, as Kant does, resulting in the famous ''meta-critical'' aporia of his Critical project, this should be the very first item on the transcendental agenda. And according to Gabriel it takes us directly to Schelling and Hegel, who grasp that, as soon as the structure of objective cognition has been determined as finite and thus unable to account for itself, a commitment to the reality of the infinite has been taken on, and that is what is therefore required if there is to be a self-accounting cognition, one that redeems its own ontological claim as a way of modelling the infinite and its relation to the finite that (i) does not make the infinite transcendent and thus inaccessible, and (ii) does not contradict the concept of the infinite by leaving the finite outside it. This is why meta-cognitive reflection does not simply repeat the merely negative skeptical result of reflection on first-order cognition: insofar as it builds on the discovery that objective cognition is determined by finitude, transcendental reflection, it incorporates skepticism, which has been granted methodological significance and is allowed to shape (''dogmatic'') ontological claims. Transcendental ontology ''combines both the methodology of higher-order reflection initiated by Kant and the traditional attempt to grasp being as being'' (xix).

With the programme of transcendental ontology thus outlined, Gabriel explains in Chapters 2 and 3 how on his view it should be filled out. Three things are done interconnectedly in the course of these chapters. First, Gabriel gives an account of what is perhaps (though the competition is intense) the most opaque sub-area within German Idealism, namely the theory of being in Schelling's late philosophy. Second, this theory is shown to lead directly into an account of human freedom, drawn from Schelling's 1809 essay but elaborated by Gabriel in a way that bears the stamp of twentieth-century existentialism. Third, the superiority of Schelling's achievement over that of Hegel emerges as a consequence of both the greater depth of Schelling's insight into being and the consideration that it makes human freedom thinkable in a way that Hegel's system does not.

To begin with the first of these: The ontologization of transcendental reflection entails, Gabriel says, that ''analysis of the concept of existence'' is ''methodologically prior to the analysis of the subject's access to existence'' (ix). This assertion of methodological priority recalls Heidegger, as of course does the whole idea of transcendental ontology. But Gabriel does not agree with the Heidegger of Being and Time that the question of being demands an analytic of Dasein, nor with the later Heidegger that philosophy is condemned to admit the strict ineffability of being: what is needed for fundamental ontology is found instead in Schelling's account of ''unprethinkable being'' and theory of ''potencies''. The key to Gabriel's elucidation of Schelling's account is a distinction that he draws between two ways of conceiving being philosophically.

(1) Being is conceived ''logically'' when it is identified outright with something's being the case or thus-and-so. In Gabriel's nice image, this yields a flat ontology: whatever distinctions an ontology may draw of different modes, types or orders of being (the divine and the human, spirit and nature, etc.), an ontology which recognizes only the ''logical'' concept of being is flat in the sense that it regards being as consisting always and only in determinacy. Flat ontologies need not of course regard determinate being as unanalyzable -- determinate being can be given the sort of structural description found in, for example, Frege or Hegel's Logic -- but since they admit nothing beyond it, they must regard explanation as a relation that can hold only within the realm of determinate being, which to that extent is treated as an absolute primitive.

(2) The contrast is with the ''historical'' concept of being found in Schelling. Once again the designation is suggestive of Heidegger, but what Gabriel envisages has nothing to do with Heidegger's history of metaphysics (it does have a connection with human history, but this is indirect and lies some way ahead). Being is interpreted ''historically'', for Gabriel, when it is regarded as having an internal structure the elucidation of which requires a distinction of moments composing what Gabriel calls its logical past, present and future.

Ontology thus acquires a third dimension, which cuts into and across the obtaining of determinate states of affairs: to describe determinate being as ''historical'' is to say that there is within it, composing the fact of its ''obtaining'', a complex order analogous with a temporal sequence but exhibiting also the organic and teleological form of a historical development. This allows sense to be made of the puzzling conceptual figure of retrojection found throughout Schelling's writings, whereby what is originally presented as primordial and without relation to anything outside itself is later redetermined in light of what is ontologically downstream from it, as related internally to its ontological consequences. Thus ''unprethinkable being'' is both beyond thought and internally related to it as its presupposition.

The first key point distinguishing Gabriel's Schellingian account of determinate being from Hegel's Logic is, therefore, that the seemingly paradoxical structure whereby what comes later in ''logical time'' modifies what comes earlier is philosophically final: it defines the being of thought or judgement, and cannot be recouped in terms of a conceptual sequence. Unlike the sequence that composes Hegel's Logic -- which is genuinely timeless, and so can be represented as a circle, for which reason Schelling denies that there is genuine movement in Hegel's dialectic -- the Schellingian dynamic requires tensed language for its expression and has yet to achieve closure (whether it ever does so is undecided). Schelling's solution to the problem of where to locate the infinite -- since it cannot lie ''apart'' from the finite -- is thus opposed to Hegel's identification of the infinite with the self-sublation of the finite: the infinite consists for Schelling in the inexhaustible determinability of unprethinkable being, the possibility of multiplying indefinitely (though not arbitrarily) the senses by means of which we refer to a unitary reality. The second point is that, by making determinate being the explanandum of ontological reflection, we single out logical space, the space of reasons within which judgements and their determinate objects are situated, as something that, although it has an outside, cannot find its reason in what is outside it, and so cannot be necessary; hence the Schellingian contingency, as opposed to Hegelian necessity, that attaches at the second-order level to the domain of determinate being. Third and finally, in the full Schellingian picture, when ontology is joined to the theory of freedom, the ''historical'' concept of being is brought under that ofpersonality: the ''historical'' order within the fact of determinate being has the character of a project underway, a yet-to-be-completed doing, and must be thought to advance by acts of will, and hence exhibits freedom, not rational necessity.

That transcendental discourse is on Gabriel's construal ontologically committed does not, of course, render its commitments platonistic, and Gabriel in fact situates his reading of Hegel in a ''middle ground'' between neoplatonic ontotheology and the deflationary view according to which nothing ontological is involved in the transition from Kant to Hegel (37). In so far as Gabriel reads Hegel's speculative philosophy as deriving from a critique of the platonism of transcendent metaphysics, and Schelling as reconceiving being in the non-theological terms of fields of sense and conditions for logical space, the aim of avoiding both ontotheology and a neoplatonistic distinction of appearance and reality is fulfilled.

However, what counts as middle ground in this context depends on one's choice of map, and it is noteworthy that transcendental reflection on Gabriel's account does not subjectivize itself and does not forbear from identifying its own reflections as self-relations of reality itself: ''finite subjects . . . change the structure of what there is by referring to it''; the possibility of reference through a judgement to something that is not a judgement presupposes that ''the world refers to itself through our reference to it''; ''the world manage[s] to become self-referential in reflection''; the human being ''is that creature which relates the whole to itself, that moment in the dynamic of creation which brings the whole to itself'' (ix, xii, 98). If transcendental reflection were necessarily disengaged from ontology, as per Kant, then the attribution of intentionality to reality, and of trans-subjective agency to concepts and pre-empirical principles, would make no sense -- Hegel's ''self-determination of the Concept'' and the productivity of Schelling's Potenzen would then be matters fit for paraphrase into statements about how we must think. But if Gabriel's characterization of the transcendental task is correct, to circumscribe transcendental thoughts merely as cogitative acts of human entities would be for transcendental thinking to reduce itself to a set of determinate episodes within the finite, subjectivizing itself and thereby cancelling its claim to encompass in thought that which the skeptic denies our grasp of. A thin but unmistakeable commitment to conceptual and pre-empirical dynamism, irreducible to human subjectivity, is therefore not just licensed by Gabriel's transcendental ontology but required by it.3

It follows that, on one metric at least, Gabriel falls closer to the neoplatonic than to the deflationary end of the spectrum. This is however not an objection or even an embarrassment, for there is nothing in Gabriel's project that demands or even seeks a rapprochement with naturalism. The naturalist's exclusive ontology of spatio-temporal particulars is left behind early on, its deficiency shown by its failure to meet the skeptical challenge. On Gabriel's estimate, all attempts to simply contain skepticism within bounds, or to deflect it by immanent manoeuvres within the field of knowledge, prove inadequate.4 In order for naturalism to offer itself as an alternative to German Idealism, the naturalist would therefore need to declare that the challenge of skepticism which sponsors the German Idealist project is null and void, a non-problem ab initio which deserves not even G. E. Moore's gesture of refutation -- which is simply to shrug off the responsibilities that define the project of epistemology. One of the several attractions of Gabriel's interpretation of German Idealism is that by harnessing skepticism as its underlying motive power, its metaphysical commitments come to be seen as doing work that needs to be done.

1 Eckart Förster, The Twenty-Five Years of Philosophy: A Systematic Reconstruction, trans. Brady Bowman (Harvard: Harvard University Press, 2012).

2 Gabriel's interpretation of the late Schelling is set out in an appropriately expansive form in Der Mensch im Mythos. Untersuchungen über Ontotheologie, Anthropologie und Selbstbewußtseinsgeschichte in Schellings ''Philosophie der Mythologie'' (Berlin: de Gruyter, 2006).

3 Of interest and relevance here is Gabriel's reading of Plotinus in relation to Sextus Empiricus in Skeptizismus und Idealismus in der Antike (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2009).

4 Argued by Gabriel in An der Grenzen der Erkenntnistheorie. Die notwendige Endlichkeit des objektiven Wissens als Lektion des Skeptizismus (München: Alber, 2008).