Transfigurements: On the True Sense of Art

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John Sallis, Transfigurements: On the True Sense of Art, University of Chicago Press, 2008, 192pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226734224.

Reviewed by Wayne J. Froman, George Mason University


Transfigurements: On the True Sense of Art by John Sallis is an exceptionally rich and rewarding text. The text comprises an introduction, titled "Prefigurements," and eight chapters.

The first chapter, "The Invisibility of Painting," calls attention to the current significance of art for philosophy and signals how Sallis will address art in this volume. The import of art today pertains to the collapse of the distinction, beginning in Plato, between the sensible and the intelligible. It is this distinction that has governed philosophy of art. The distinction's collapse means that the essence of art has to be rethought "from the ground up."

The next three chapters, "Nature's Song," "Mixed Arts," and "Music and Imagination," largely address Kant's work in aesthetics and questions posed by that work, although the question concerning the status of a bird's song, or of "nature's song," a-propos art, also returns Sallis to the charming and illuminating discussion between Socrates and Phaedrus, in Plato's Phaedrus, concerning the song of the cicadas. The distinction between the sensible and the intelligible is both crucial and problematic in Kant's work, in such a way that might signal, in effect, an impending collapse. Sallis observes that while it would certainly appear that "there is nothing more natural than song," at the same time, "from the moment humans begin to sing, they will always already have broached and stationed themselves within the most classical oppositions: freedom/nature, art/nature, intelligible/sensible, signification/sense."

In song they will always already have opened the most gigantic space within sense, that of the very sense of sense. Philosophy -- and not least of all Kant -- contests this space and yet recognizes that, even in contesting it, thinking must preserve it and move ever again across it.

Following, patiently and at extraordinarily close range, the difficulties and the aporias in Kant's work where this fissuring shows up at the surface, so to speak, Sallis provides an account of basic equivocation on Kant's part with respect to music's status vis-à-vis the other arts as well as vis-à-vis nature. The suggestion is that while Kant neither set out to accord music a very distinct status nor explicitly concluded that it had such status, music, in the end, might be accorded a very distinct status. Furthermore, that status may even mark a "bifurcation" within the arts, one that pertains to "sense," meaning both how "one can sense something sensible, apprehend by sense a sensible thing, and [how] one can have a sense for what it means, comprehend its sense" (as Sallis's introductory "Prefigurements" already specified the sense or senses of "sense").

The fifth and sixth chapters, "Carnation and the Eccentricity of Painting" and "Soundings", address Hegel on painting and music respectively. In each of these cases, the true "sense" of art and its import vis-à-vis the collapse of the distinction between the sensible and the intelligible is very much at stake. According to Hegel, it is in sculpture that spirit is most fully presented in a sensible medium. This means that sculpture is the classical mode of art par excellence. This classical mode of art attains its height in Greece at the very moment when religion takes the form of art. Sculpture there is a site of divine presence. Understood in terms of the degree of presentation of spirit in a sensible medium, classical art is an advance from the symbolic mode of art, and it is followed by the romantic mode. Painting is a specifically romantic art and its moment comes later in history. While painting's moment is a decline, in effect, from the highest degree of presentation of spirit in a sensible medium, at the same time spirit's departure from painting is also indicative of the point where religious imagery is left behind and spirit attains its own proper plane. But as spirit departs it leaves painting to the play of what Hegel holds is its most essential element: coloration. It is now that painting attains a new height when portraying human flesh. This allows Hegel, in discussing specific paintings, to indicate a development of painting that is at odds with the constraints of his system and that specifically is not easily recaptured by his assessment that art, with regard to its highest possibilities, is, for us, a thing of the past.

"Transfigurement of sense" is what color undergoes on its own at this point. The word "transfigurement" is a variation on "transfiguration" (as Sallis's introductory "Prefigurements" already specified), and primary references for the latter are found in Plato's dialogues as well as in the account of an event in the life of Jesus. "Transfiguration" is understood specifically in an "ascensional" sense, while Sallis's "transfigurement" allows for "ascensional" and "decensional," as well "recessional" modes. A-propos this "transfigurement," Sallis had already made the point in his chapter that what Hegel always found most astonishing in regard to painting is how "no matter what is to be presented, it is … only a matter of spreading colors across a surface, thereby, by the mere spread of colors, everything -- all manner of things in their most complex and subtle differences -- is there for us to behold."

Hegel specifies in his Lectures on Aesthetics that "the chief task of music is letting resound not the objective world itself but, on the contrary, the way in which the innermost self is moved in its subjectivity and spirituality." This accounts for the elemental power of music and it relies on the role of time as the universal medium of music. Sallis makes the particularly thought-provoking suggestion that were the spatial quality of music also to be taken into account, one might find in music as well an intimation of the elemental power of nature. For Hegel, music is a romantic art that brings us a step closer to the point where spirit has left a sensible medium behind. This is how Sallis specifies music's affinity with painting: "and just as, in painting, the human soul sees itself traced in human flesh, so, says Hegel [in the Lectures on Aesthetics,' in song the soul rings out from its own body.'" In song, one may hover in the pure feeling of self. As is the case throughout the text, the scholarship in the chapters that address Hegel on painting and on music is true to form for Sallis, both in terms of its extensiveness and its meticulousness. Sallis draws on the different transcriptions of Hegel's lectures as well as on his personal correspondence. While there are any number of pleasures that await a reader in this text, for this reader, one of them certainly has to be details from Hegel's reports from his travels to see works of art and the accounts of his attendance at musical performances.

In the text's penultimate chapter, "Preposterous Ascents: On Comedy and Philosophy,"

Sallis looks at how comedy and philosophy address one another and how each shows up in the other. The figure is known from history of the philosopher lost in the "intelligible" and unable to see the "sensible" dead ahead. Shakespeare, Hegel, and Plato play major roles in Sallis's engagement between comedy and philosophy. Sallis looks at a parody on philosophy from A Midsummer Night's Dream, at how, for Hegel, it is comedy that brings art to a close, at how comic moments in Plato's dialogues actually display what takes place at the point where art is delivered over to philosophy, and at what takes place in those philosophical moments within the profoundest comedies, such as A Midsummer Night's Dream, which "arise from the depths of blindness." The way that comedy involves an undermining of self-identical presence bears comparison with the gesture that is proper to the beginning of philosophy.

In the concluding chapter, "The Promise of Art," Sallis turns to Heidegger's The Origin of the Work of Art, where the "sense of sense" is in question from the preliminary discussion of Aristotle's four causes, to the discussion of the distinction of form and matter, to the modern subjectivist context, to the basis for Heidegger's contention with aesthetics, and to the strife between the element of earth, on the one hand, and world, on the other, that Heidegger finds at the heart of the work of art. Along with The Origin of the Work of Art, Heidegger's Nietzsche lectures and the role played there by Nietzsche's assessment to the effect that his own thought was an inversion of platonism prove particularly pertinent to the question of the "sense of sense". Sallis closes by raising a question in regard to Heidegger's point that the rift that opens up in an artwork where the intimate contention between concealment and emergence occurs always gets set back in an artwork into the element of earth and into that element alone. Sallis asks if it is not the case that there are works where this rift gets set back into other such basic elements. If this much is so, a response to Heidegger's suspension of judgment with regard to Hegel's judgment concerning the highest possibilities of art as past is indicated. Artworks in which the future of art is harbored in terms of their promise may already be in our midst.

In the opening chapter, Sallis indicates how the phenomenological work of Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty and others opened a philosophical response to the collapse of the distinction between the sensible and the intelligible. Features of this text can call to mind dynamics associated with "deconstruction." For example, there is the way in which unobtrusive passages from one or another philosopher challenge the systematic restraints within the philosopher's work and at times open rifts in the work or even fracture it, while at the same time, attesting to the philosophic strength of the work. Throughout, there is the question of the "binary opposition" between sensible and intelligible. At the same time, the way in which "voice" figures in the text reopens issues that go back to Derrida's Speech and Phenomenon. While such dynamics of deconstruction go unannounced "as such," one is put in mind of Derrida's repeated remarks with regard to his own sparing use of the term, and even more so, of his characterizations of any negative features of "deconstruction" as only one side of the point while the promise of "deconstruction" had yet to be addressed.

A signal feature of Sallis's work is his attention to specific artworks that including works by Titian and Monet in painting, Shakespeare in theater, and Mahler in music. By virtue of this major feature of the text, the text in fact displays what it discusses in regard to the "sense of sense" beyond a distinction of sensible and intelligible. This intimacy between the philosopher and what he is about is perfectly suited to a text in which philosophic questions of the highest and deepest character in regard to selfhood are not far at all from the surface of the text.

The character of Sallis's scholarship in this volume is matched throughout by clarity of thought. With Transfigurements: On the True Sense of Art, he makes a lasting contribution to the philosophy of art.