Transformation of the Self in the Thought of Friedrich Schleiermacher

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Jacqueline Mariña, Transformation of the Self in the Thought of Friedrich Schleiermacher, Oxford University Press, 2008, 270pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199206377.

Reviewed by C. Jeffery Kinlaw, McMurry University


Jacqueline Mariña has written an important book, one that clearly, in this reviewer's judgment, is the best book on Schleiermacher in the expanding English-language literature on it. Her book has notable merits, principal among them being its defense of Schleiermacher's overall moral theory as both the cornerstone of his thought and the proper point of entry for understanding his theology. Mariña demonstrates with prodigious clarity and with unsurprising (for those familiar with her previous work) mastery of texts from Kant, Schleiermacher, and Leibniz that Schleiermacher's philosophical ethics deserves serious attention from contemporary Anglo-American analytic philosophers (the recognition of Schleiermacher's importance for contemporary philosophy has been commonplace in Germany). She shows how Schleiermacher developed, through his intensive engagement with Kant and to a lesser extent Spinoza and Leibniz, a consistent and coherent moral theory that combines assets of both an ethics of duty and virtue ethics. Her extensive discussions of Schleiermacher's efforts to confront problems in Kant's ethics and his appropriation of Kant's theory of subjectivity alone are adequate payoff for reading her book. Those interested more specifically in Schleiermacher would benefit considerably from working through her arguments for the importance of Leibniz in the development of Schleiermacher's mature theology, especially as background for explicating what for Schleiermacher constitutes our basic relation to the divine: the absolute feeling of dependence.

The ultimate goal of Mariña's project is to provide a perspicuous account of Schleiermacher's theory of moral and spiritual transformation and to explicate the metaphysical concepts that underlie that theory. Accordingly, her book culminates with a discussion of Schleiermacher's Christology. Herein lies another important insight in her work. It is commonplace for theologians -- that is, those who actually give more than a cursory reading of his theological system -- to acknowledge the strong Christocentric foundation in Schleiermacher's theology. Mariña goes a step further, though without explicitly saying so, by locating the center of Schleiermacher's theology in his theory of redemption -- thus the salience of his moral theory. This is an important insight and, in my view, utterly on target. Her book therefore unfolds as a narration of the development of Schleiermacher's ethics, from his early unpublished essay On Freedom, through the Spinoza notes from 1792-1793, the Leibniz notes from 1797-1798 and the Monologen, to the 1805 Brouillon zur Ethik and finally his mature theological system The Christian Faith. She shows, correctly I think, that most of the components of his theory were in place by the time he began to lecture on philosophical ethics in Berlin in 1812/1813. Her most interesting, and indeed most controversial, claim is that Schleiermacher abandons the compatibilism he had defended most of his career when he writes his theological system and embraces a highly nuanced version of transcendental freedom, highly nuanced in the sense that absolute dependence on God is a necessary condition for transcendental freedom in relation to the world.

The book is divided into eight chapters. The first three chapters focus on the early Schleiermacher and offer a careful reading of On Freedom and the Spinoza notebooks. Their underlying theme is Schleiermacher's attempt to confront the problem of the unity of the self both as (1) a moral agent and as (2) an allegedly substantial self. Mariña contends that Schleiermacher's arguments for (1) fail, whereas he argues against (2). Chapter one is devoted to On Freedom and the case for (1).

In On Freedom Schleiermacher attempts to defend a compatibilist version of Kantian practical philosophy. Two Kantian issues drive his discussion: how a purely rational principle can motivate the will and the problem of transcendental freedom. Mariña argues that Schleiermacher's compatibilism fails because moral motivation, even on Schleiermacher's own model, requires transcendental freedom, which of course he rejects. Her narration can be summarized as follows: Schleiermacher perceptively recognizes that motivation involves a judgment about the worthiness of an object of desire. Accordingly, he distinguishes between desire in the weak sense of a simple craving for X and a desire for X in the sense of the satisfaction of the desire for X being a serious contender for possible action. For a desire to be volitional -- or for a desire for X successfully to move the will to action -- and for the action to be freely executed, desire must be supplemented by relevant beliefs about X. This seems to be the point Mariña has in mind when she notes that, for Schleiermacher, the intensity with which one desires X is determined in part by the way in which X is represented. Since beliefs about X can influence one's desire for X (for instance, Joe craves large portions of red meat, but accepts his cardiologist's view that Joe's history of red meat indulgence has contributed to the deterioration of his cardiovascular functions and so opts for fish), there always remains the possibility that an agent, when acting, could choose an alternative course of action. Schleiermacher's compatibilism thus isn't a simple strongest desire compatibilism. No matter how strongly an agent craves X, her craving doesn't entail that she will seek to obtain X. Now for the moral law to motivate the will, there must be a correlated incentive or desire to uphold the moral law. But acting on the moral law requires that one recognize that so acting is superior to non-moral alternatives, and this recognition requires transcendental freedom. Mariña's argument is implicit, but can be reconstructed as follows:

1. For the moral law to function as a practical principle for an agent S, S must be able to explain why acting on the basis of the moral law (L) is superior to not doing so (N).

2. Selecting L over N requires that S recognize the worth of L over N and have that recognition of L's value inform S's doing L.

3. Satisfying (2) presupposes the incorporation thesis: for L to be a decisive motive for S, S must incorporate L into the principle on which S acts.

4. There is incorporation only if there is transcendental freedom.

5. Therefore, transcendental freedom is a necessary condition for L to function as a practical principle.

The merits of this Allisonian argument aside, why can't Schleiermacher meet the recognition of worth requirement simply with the belief that upholding the moral law is always the most worthy goal? And why can't the motive to uphold the moral law be a product of early moral education? Mariña also maintains that since Schleiermacher's compatibilism means that since an agent's action is always entailed by her antecedent states, she can't account for the fact that an agent must be the initiator of any action attributed to her. That is, Schleiermacher can't move beyond the conclusion that the agent is a "mere locus wherein a predetermined event takes place" (41). Mariña needs this conclusion, because it enables her to show more seamlessly how Schleiermacher's denial in the Spinoza notes of real individualism builds on the implication of this conclusion as though he had embraced it. But does the conclusion follow without begging the question in favor of transcendental freedom? Schleiermacher's considered view is that since beliefs affect the influence of desires, and beliefs can change with new information, the outcome of an agent's choice is practically indeterminate until the moment antecedent to her action. Thereby, the bogeyman of determinism is seriously weakened.

Chapters two and three focus on the Spinoza notebooks and specifically Schleiermacher's arguments against substantial individuals. His core argument is epistemological. For X to be a substance, X must have its own inherent principle of individuation. But how do we know whether or not phenomenal objects, which are represented through synthetic acts of the understanding, map onto metaphysically real objects? The upshot seems to be that concepts, or the imagination's synthetic acts, 'go all the way out', and accordingly, all discrimination and determination are products of the imagination. This claim might be defensible on the basis of Schleiermacher's epistemology lectures, but it seems at best suggestive in the Spinoza notebooks. A second argument concerns the problem of individuation in succession and alteration. Given that determinations of X are tied to determinations of other things, the only identifiable substrate for succession would be extension, thus eliminating substantially real individuals.

Chapter three explores the extension of the individuation problem to the nature of the self. The argument has two steps. The first step asserts criteria for substantial selfhood, namely, unity of consciousness and real identity of selfhood, and shows that only the first criterion can be met. Though we are aware of unity of consciousness, that awareness doesn't entail substantial unity. Since substantial unity can't be proven from a 1st or 3rd person perspective, an agent is only a phenomenal self and thus not a metaphysically real individual. Schleiermacher's argument turns on his reading of Kant's theory of apperception as a logical subject; Mariña's explication of this connection is quite impressive. The second step is this: Schleiermacher agrees that thought can't be reduced to mechanism, but irreducibility doesn't preclude the possibility that thought and extension might be grounded in a single substrate. Interestingly, Mariña claims that Schleiermacher adopts the Spinozist conclusion and thereby at this stage embraces pantheism. This conclusion seems exaggerated. Why not read Schleiermacher more accurately as exploring experimentally the implications of the Spinozist position from limited access through Jacobi's quotations and in light of Kantian commitments?

Chapters four through six trace the development of Schleiermacher's conception of individuality, first by showing the influence of Leibniz (this section is noteworthy and to my knowledge the first discussion of the Leibniz connection in English) and then showing how Schleiermacher's theory turns impressively on a thick conception of recognition. Chapter four argues that Leibniz is an important source for the development of Schleiermacher's theory of subjectivity. Specifically, Schleiermacher inverts Leibniz: one's self-conception arises from one's engagement with the other so that the world becomes a mirror of self. Since all representations are relational, they are representations of one's relation to the world apprehended from one's distinct standpoint. Mariña argues that Schleiermacher develops this account in two steps. First, she shows that the imagination's spontaneity indicates one's freedom in relation to the world, a freedom that can't be reduced to mechanistic responses. This locus of freedom, more importantly, will become the point of contact for immediate relation to God. Step two reconstructs Schleiermacher's argument in the Monologen that self-consciousness develops only insofar as one can recognize herself in her everyday projects and her engagement with others. This move is crucial, and becomes the basis for Schleiermacher's account of moral transformation.

Chapter five explicates Schleiermacher's mature conception of the highest good. There are two key points, both building on the end of chapter four. First, Schleiermacher advances a higher notion of eudaimonism: genuine happiness involves inter-subjective valuation. The way we values others affects the way our own value is reflected in how others value us. Happiness is a social conception, and depends upon a model of recognition stronger than what one finds in late 18th century natural right theories. Second, Schleiermacher moves beyond Kant in developing a virtue ethic, specifically by exploring how desires can be transformed so that they harmonize with the desires of others. The highest good is the ultimate ideal: one knows herself through community and the community knows itself through her.

Chapter six begins by applying the question of how desires can have ethical content to Schleiermacher's theory of individuality. That is, how can reason transform one's moral psychology in one's particularity as an individual? The aim of the discussion is to advance an initial explication of immediate self-consciousness. For Schleiermacher, immediate self-consciousness marks the transition point between moments of spontaneity and receptivity within cognitive functions, specifically the transition between moments when one or the other predominates. One recognizes the sheer givenness of the self in immediate self-consciousness, that the basis for one's spontaneity and receptivity is not self-constituted -- in short, that one isn't the author of one's being. Traditionally, explications of immediate self-consciousness draw on Schleiermacher's lectures on epistemology and, accordingly, present his theory as central to the foundation for knowledge. Mariña, however, explores the givenness of the self in its juxtaposition with others. This allows her to show that Schleiermacher's theory informs ethics. In my judgment, this is truly an original contribution! Given that one stands in relation to others, alternating between moments of spontaneous action and receptive influence, there must be a ground unifying both yet outside the self. What grounds the self enables one to act spontaneously in loving others and to receptively see oneself reflected (and thus fulfilled) in others' recognition of one as loving.

From this breakthrough in chapter six, Mariña then moves seamlessly to Schleiermacher's Christology in chapter seven and the way in which union cum Christi can become transformative. Since God transcends the distinction between self and world, God's transformative activity must enter our lives at that transition point between moments of spontaneity and moments of receptivity. Here one relates immediately to God. The "reflective rift" between spontaneity and activity is one's openness to divine activity. How so? Consider Christ's distinctive nature: the being of God in Christ is the motivational force and the spontaneous element in all his actions. This in turn exhibits Jesus' vital receptivity in relation to the world, thereby enabling him to receive the world back as an object of divine love. In sum, Jesus reflects the world as loved by God. What Schleiermacher calls Christ's Wirksamkeit transforms us similarly by becoming the motivational force in our actions and thereby enabling us to express divine love by recognizing others as valuable and as capable likewise of expressing divine love. Jesus' efficacious activity toward us through divine love alters our self-conception and thereby energizes our capacity to express divine love.

Thus we have the culmination of Mariña's project: for Schleiermacher our relation to God is ethical. That is, the transition point in cognitive functions (immediate self-consciousness, that point which transcends the world and the phenomenal self) is the point of entry for God's morally transformative grace as mediated by the risen Christ. Christ's efficacious activity transforms our moral psychology -- infuses our incentives with ethical/spiritual content -- by becoming the motivational source of our actions particularly in relation to others. From this very impressive explication of Christ's redemptive work in chapter seven, one might expect that Mariña would conclude her project with a reconstruction of Schleiermacher's account of the economy of salvation/redemption in the Christian Faith, particularly since he subsumes justification under the larger narrative of sanctification (analogous to merging creation with providence). But Mariña doesn't move in this direction. Rather, she ends by showing the way in which Schleiermacher's ethically grounded theology can contribute to contemporary discussions of religious pluralism. This is the one disappointment I find in her book.

The most striking and important claim in chapter eight is that Schleiermacher abandons his earlier compatibilism and embraces in Christian Faith a nuanced version of transcendental freedom. The argument is this: divine transformative influence occurs in immediate self-consciousness, that point at which one is independent of the world. Divine activity interjects something utterly unique into the world. Accordingly, actions following from divine transformative activity don't follow from antecedent states of the world. In this sense acts expressive of divine love are spontaneous in relation to the world. I don't find this argument convincing, precisely because it ignores the elephant in the room, namely, the problem of explicating how divine activity transforms human subjectivity and does so in a way that preserves human freedom. Mariña maintains that divine influence functions as a formal cause. Yet Schleiermacher's word here is Wirksamkeit, thus indicating clearly that divine transformative power is efficacious. Even if divine activity is a formal cause, originally it had to be infused via an efficient cause. Schleiermacher attempts to confront these issues in Christian Faith, 106. In sum, even if divine transformative power makes one transcendentally free in relation to the world, it doesn't follow that one is transcendentally free überhaupt.

In sum, this is the best book on Schleiermacher in English. Had Mariña confronted the problem of divine agency and human freedom with the same rigor and perspicacity evident in her study overall, the book would have been even better.