Transformative Experience

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L. A. Paul, Transformative Experience, Oxford University Press, 2014, 189pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198717959.

Reviewed by Krister Bykvist, Stockholm University


Can we make a rational choice about whether to become a vampire (if we somehow could have that option), whether to have a child, whether to join a war, or whether to become a doctor? 'Not unless you assign value to discovering what it is like to be a vampire, a parent, a soldier, or a doctor, a value that holds no matter whether these experiences themselves are good or bad' is the surprising answer L. A. Paul gives in her book. In fact, she claims her answer applies, more generally, to all transformative decisions -- decisions which would bring about radically different experiences and could radically change your personality and preferences. It is a surprising answer since, on the face of it, one would have thought that you can rationally choose not to become a vampire because you find it deeply immoral to be a vampire, choose to have child because you think it is objectively good to create a child who will live a happy life and have loving relationship with you and others, choose not to join the war because you think it is unjust, and choose to become a doctor because you think it would be virtuous to cure the illness that took your own sister's life.

Paul does in fact concede that these choices could all be rational, but she sets aside all considerations pertaining to morality, objective values, mere happiness, and virtues. (p. 25) Her focus is much more narrow. She assumes that the agent is concerned with what she calls subjective values, which 'capture the rich, complex nature of lived experiences resulting from our sensory as well as our non-sensory cognitive phenomenology' (p. 12), and thus are not just a matter of pleasure or displeasure. Furthermore, Paul assumes that the agent's method of gaining information about what it is like to live in a certain future is to imagine living there by projecting experiences she has already had into this future. The problem for the agent facing a transformative choice is now the following (pp. 31-33). Since the agent bases her choice on subjective values of future outcomes, she needs to know what the various accessible outcomes would be like for her. In order to know this, she needs to already have had the experiences these outcomes promise. But since the decision is transformative, some of these future experiences are radically different from her current ones. She is thus barred from knowing at the time of decision what it would be like to have these experiences. Since she can't know what it is like to have these experiences, she is unable to know the subjective values of the radically different future experiences. But without this knowledge she cannot compare the accessible outcomes and make a rational decision about which one to realize.

For example, if the agent is facing the choice of becoming a vampire, she needs to know the subjective value of being one before she can make a rational choice, but this is impossible since in order to know this value she needs to know what vampire experiences are like. And in order to know what these experiences are like, she needs to already have had them. But as a human she can't have these experiences since vampire experiences are radically different from human experiences. Similar reasoning is supposed to apply to all other cases of transformative decisions. For future reference, let us call this argument 'the argument from radical ignorance.'

Paul thinks the problem with transformative decisions is 'doubly serious' for

not only do you not know the values before you've had the relevant experience, but having the experience can change your preferences, and so the values you would (per impossibile) assign these outcomes before having the transformative experience could be radically different from the values you'd assign to the relevant outcomes after having had the experience. So because you don't know what the experience is like, you don't know how your preferences will change as a result of having the transformative experience. (p. 32)

Paul's favoured solution to the problem of transformative choice is to evade the argument from radical ignorance by 'reconfiguring' and 'revising' the decision by acknowledging the subjective value of discovering or coming to know the intrinsic nature of experiences, whether or not these experiences themselves will be subjectively good or bad. (pp. 38-39) So, when you consider the option of becoming a vampire you should not frame the decision as involving a choice to realize the outcome described as what it is like to be a vampire, but as involving a choice to realize an outcome described as discovering what it is like to be a vampire. (p. 114) The same holds for the other transformative decisions. When you wonder whether to become a parent, you should ask yourself whether you want to discover what it is like to be a parent; when you wonder whether to join the war, you should ask yourself whether you would want to discover what it is like to be a soldier; and when you wonder whether to become a doctor, you should ask yourself whether you would want to discover what it is like to be a doctor. By invoking this revelatory value you can now compare the outcome of a transformative experience to status quo.

This, I take it, is the main thrust of Paul's account, but her book also contains a lot of other interesting applications and extensions, for example, a discussion of the controversial question of whether deaf parents who have had a deaf child should opt for giving their child an implant that will restore the child's hearing. (pp. 57-64) But I will focus on what I take to be one of the most original contributions: the argument from radical ignorance and Paul's solution to the problem it generates.

Let us start by getting a bit clearer on what Paul means by 'rational agent' and 'subjective value'. A rational agent, according to her, is an agent who follows the rules of 'realistic normative decision theory'. (p. 18) It is realistic in the sense that it applies to real world cases. (p. 19) According to this theory, you should determine the probabilities of the relevant states of the world, which combined with your acts will lead to outcomes. You should also determine the values of the possible outcomes and, after calculating the expected value of each action, choose the one with the highest expected value. Finally, the assignments of values and degrees of beliefs must be based on sufficient evidence. Now the first thing to say about this model of rationality is that it is far from realistic since it depicts the agent as (i) consciously reasoning in terms of credences and values -- they have 'psychological reality' to the agent, as Paul puts it; and (ii) as being able to work out the greatest expected value of an act. But let this pass -- after all, Paul's model could perhaps be more narrowly applied to ideal agents making transformative choices -- and let us instead move to the notion of subjective values.

Paul claims that a predominant cultural paradigm in the Western world is that we should approach many major life decisions 'as personal matters where a central feature of what is at stake is what it will be like for us to experience the outcomes of our acts, and where the subjective value we assign to an outcome depends upon what we care about, whatever that might be.' (p. 25) So the problem of transformative experiences is a problem for rational agents that satisfy this cultural paradigm. The paradigm sounds familiar if you think about how typical agents care about their own pleasures or pains. But this is not what Paul has in mind. Subjective values, according to her, are not merely values of pleasure and pain. Instead, they

can be grounded by more than merely qualitative or sensory characters, as they may also arise from nonsensory phenomenological features of experiences, especially rich, developed experiences that embed a range of mental states, including beliefs, emotions, and desires. (p. 12)

One problem with this characterization of subjective values is that they are both supposed to 'depend on' what we care about and be 'grounded by' sensory and nonsensory phenomenological features. But then we need to know whether the phenomenological features of our experiences can influence subjective value independently of how much we care about these features. At times, Paul seems to think the answer is yes; she claims, for instance, that the subjective value of the outcome of eating a durian fruit is partially a matter of the phenomenal intensity of what it is like for you to taste a durian, and 'so the magnitude of the positive or negative subjective value is not just determined by the fact that the durian tastes good (or bad) to you, but by how intense your taste experience is.' (p. 35) Similarly, when discussing the option of becoming a vampire, Paul claims that it is possible that the phenomenal intensity of the experience of becoming a vampire will swamp the phenomenal intensity of the experiences in other outcomes. (p. 43) This is a very controversial view of value, to say the least, and is hardly part of our cultural paradigm. It is not common to think that the fact that the taste of a fruit is extremely bitter can make it subjectively good even if the agent finds it disgusting.

A more plausible idea might instead be that the agent's responses call the shots when it comes to subjective value, so something has subjective value for an agent if and only if the agent cares about it in virtue of some of its sensory or nonsensory phenomenal features. The more the agent cares about it, the more subjective value it has, which typically is a matter of the agent caring more when the intensity of some phenomenal feature is greater. Since the phenomenal feature need not be sensory, the agent may care about the nonsensory phenomenal features of finally realizing how intensely bitter the durian fruit tastes.

However, this response-dependent notion of subjective values does not square well with other parts of Paul's account. First, as explained above, her own solution to the problem of transformative choice is to assign subjective value to revelations, which, on the response-dependent model, means that the agent is simply assumed to care about the nonsensory phenomenal features of the discovery of having a certain experience. But many normal agents do not care about such things (I myself am one). Thus Paul's solution does not seem to apply to many normal agents. What should be done about us then? Is it intrinsically irrational not to care about the nonsensory phenomenology of discoveries? That seems doubtful.

Second, Paul's claim that in order to know the subjective value of an experience you must have had it yourself is simply false if the agent's responses call the shots. In order to know that a future experience will have subjective value for you, you only need to know that you will respond to this experience on the basis of some of its phenomenal features. You need not now know what these features are like. In order to know that being a vampire will have subjective value for you, you do not need to know what it is like to be a vampire; you only need to know which outcomes you will like as a vampire. So, if the agent is concerned with response-dependent values, the argument from radical ignorance does not go through as it is stated.

It is true, as Paul repeatedly points out, that you may not know whether and how much you will like your future experiences, for example, whether you will like or dislike your vampire experiences. But this problem seems not to be of the same severity as the original one and definitely of a different kind. After all, rational choice, as Paul defines it, is about maximizing expected subjective value on the basis of evidentially supported credences. In order to do this you need to have evidentially supported credence distribution over alternative hypothesis about whether and how much your future self will like or dislike your future experiences. The fact that you do not know which of these hypotheses will be true is not relevant for the possibility of rational choice.

If the agent cannot even assign epistemically decent credences to these hypotheses, then we might have a genuine problem. It is perhaps here Paul thinks the challenge of changing preferences is especially relevant. Transformative experiences can radically change our future preferences. Now, if you had known what the future experience is like, then you could have predicted (the probability of) a certain future response. But since you don't know the experience, you cannot predict (the probability of) your future response.

Paul might be right that one source of evidence about future responses to a future experience is first-personal knowledge of the experience, but there is also third-personal information one could make use of. Paul points out, however, that relying on third-personal information from social science is problematic because there might not be any robust and fine-grained scientific results to go by. (pp. 126-136) Paul is surely right to remind us about this problem, but coarse-grained scientific results can be better than none at all. Much more needs to be said to show that this problem makes it impossible to have epistemically decent credences about one's future response-dependent subjective values.

Paul has another argument against relying on third-personal information, namely, that it would threaten our autonomy as agents. She gives the example of Sally, who has always believed that having a child will make her happy and fulfilled but decides not to have a child just because empirical evidence suggests that remaining childless would maximize her expected subjective well-being. (p. 87) Paul claims that her choice would be 'bizarre' and that she would be 'giving up autonomy for the sake of rationality'. (p. 88) It is not clear why Paul thinks this. If Sally wants to have a child because she believes that it would make her happy and maximize her expected subjective well-being and is informed that having a child would not maximize her expected subjective well-being, why would it be bizarre and a sacrifice of autonomy for her to choose to remain childless? She is just making use of relevant empirical information to make a choice on the basis of her preference for happiness and future subjective values. As Paul herself points out, rational authenticity is about doing the best one can to fulfill one’s dreams and aspirations, (p. 105) and that is exactly what Sally is doing by making use of relevant empirical information. Paul must have in mind a very different Sally, one that has no prior preference about whether to have a child but decides to remain childless just because some social scientist told her to, where the social scientist thinks she should not have a child because it would not maximize her expected subjective well-being. That would be a rather bizarre behaviour and also a sacrifice of autonomy, but this would of course go way beyond making use of third-personal empirical evidence -- it would be to give someone else the control of your future.

As pointed out above, Paul initially claims that to know the subjective value of an experience requires first-hand knowledge of it. But the in her Afterword (a bit of a misnomer since it takes up more than a quarter of the book!) she expresses doubts about this earlier claim. Even if subjective value is somehow grounded by intrinsic phenomenal features of experiences, they need not be grounded by all such features. Paul claims that it is more plausible to think that only some phenomenal features are relevant for subjective value. So, in order to know the relevant aspects of future experiences you need not have had these experiences in all their phenomenal detail and richness. You only need to know what these future experiences are like in certain respects, which you might already have encountered in experiences you have had. Perhaps in order to (at least roughly) assess the subjective value of parenthood it is enough to have had experiences of sleep deprivation, strong attachment, love, and devotion towards a vulnerable person.

In the end it is thus very unclear how much is left of Paul's initial argument from radical ignorance. If subjective values are response-dependent, it is simply false that you need to know what the future experience is like before you can value it. And even if such first-hand knowledge is required, you only need to know what it will be like in evaluatively relevant respects, and these respects may already be sufficiently experientially familiar to you.

It is clear that transformative choices can cause problems for rational choice especially when they change our deepest values. I welcome Paul's attempt to grapple with these important problems. However, I am not sure she has found the right diagnosis or cure for them. The problems have more to do with the fact that transformative choices change our deepest values than with the fact that we cannot now know in exact detail what it is like to live the transformed future lives.