Transient Truths: An Essay in the Metaphysics of Propositions

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Berit Brogaard, Transient Truths: An Essay in the Metaphysics of Propositions, Oxford University Press, 2012, 208pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199796908.

Reviewed by Ulrich Meyer, Colgate University


This ambitious book aims to revive two controversial theses: that verb tenses function like sentential operators, and that the contents of some assertions and beliefs are temporal propositions. Unlike eternal propositions, whose truth-value remains constant over time, temporal propositions have different truth-values at different times. The subtitle promises an account of the metaphysics of propositions, but most metaphysical questions about propositions, such as their role in accounts of facts, or the nature of propositions themselves, play a minor role in the discussion. This is a book in the philosophy of language, addressed to experts in the field, and it should be appreciated as such.

The majority view amongst philosophers is that the contents of beliefs are eternal propositions. Brogaard challenges this consensus view in Chapter 2, which aims to rebut an objection due to Mark Richard. If the contents of beliefs were temporal propositions, Richard argues, then the following argument should be valid, but it is not:

Mary believed that Nixon was president

Mary still believes what she once believed

Therefore, Mary believes that Nixon is president.

Brogaard's solution is to promote a novel account of belief retention, according to which it would be sufficient for Mary to believe a proposition that is appropriately related to the proposition that she once believed, but which does not need to be the same proposition. This would allow us to deny the validity of the argument without having to reject temporal belief content. Brogaard then argues that the advocates of eternal belief content are unable to give a plausible account of how people actually retain beliefs, by storing them in their brains.

Rebutting Richard's objection is a necessary component of any defense of the temporal content view, but I am not sure that it is sufficient. To establish that the content of some belief is a temporal proposition, we would need to find two times t1 and t2 such that the same proposition is believed at both times, but what is being believed at t1 is true and what is being believed at t2 is false. Since there is no need for the believer to be the same at both times, belief retention is really of secondary importance. Indeed, if Brogaard is right that belief retention does not require an agent to believe the same proposition at the two times, then the issue of belief retention is irrelevant to our question about belief content. Even if the temporalist can rebut Richard's objection, by diverting it to a discussion about belief retention, she would still have to face the main challenge of having to provide convincing examples of belief in temporal propositions. I wish Brogaard had addressed this issue in a bit more detail.

After the short Chapter 3, which argues that the best account of disagreement across time requires that the contents of at least some assertions are temporal propositions, the remainder of the book aims to revive Arthur Prior's theory that verb tenses in English function like sentential temporal operators. This operator theory originated with Prior's (alleged) discovery that putting an English verb into a tense is like adding an adverb. If we combine this with the thesis that English adverbs function as sentential operators (Montague), rather than as predicates of events (Davidson), then we end up with the linguistic thesis that verb tense needs to be spelled out in terms of sentential temporal operators such as 'P' ("it was the case that") and 'F' ("it will be the case that").

Following a brief period of popularity in the 1970s, the operator theory was quickly abandoned when it emerged that it is unable to provide a plausible account of how verb tense actually functions in English. In particular, the operator theory seems to tell the wrong story about how the tense of a verb interacts with the tenses of other verbs within the same sentence, or with explicit time adverbials such as 'On March 8th'. To give just one example, suppose we prefix the temporal operator 'P' to a sentence φ. Then '' is true at a time t just in case there is an earlier time t' < t such that φ is true at t'. This means that the doubly-modified 'PPφ' is true at t just in case there is a time t' < t such that '' is true at t', which requires there to be an even earlier time t''< t' such that φ is true at t''. Each additional operator 'P' that we prefix to a sentence shifts the time of evaluation further into the past. Verb tenses in English do not iterate like this. Consider the following sentence, which contains two verbs in the past tense:

John heard that Mary was pregnant.

If past tenses worked like the operator 'P' then this sentence would claim that there is a past time at which John heard that Mary was pregnant at an even earlier time, before the hearing, and that seems patently false. On a natural reading of the sentence, Mary is said to have been pregnant at the time of hearing, not before it. This is one of many examples that seem to show that verb tenses in English do not function like sentential operators, and which helped to persuade most linguists and philosophers of language to abandon the operator theory in favor of quantificational theories that try to account for verb tense in terms of explicit quantification over times or events.

Brogaard thinks that this shift to quantificational theories was a mistake. In Chapters 4-7, she embarks on a sustained defense of the operator theory, by trying to account for all known counterexamples. Experts will find a lot of interesting material in these chapters, but the larger picture sometimes gets a little bit lost amongst the many examples. Some promising proposals also do not get developed as fully as one might have wished. (Personally, I would have been interested to read more about the theory of composite temporal operators that Brogaard mentions in Section 4.5.)

The stated aim of Chapters 4-7 is to show that the operator theory can account for the same linguistic evidence as quantificational theories. Given the current unpopularity of the operator theory, this alone would be an important achievement, but one might wonder whether it can suffice to revive Prior's approach. The operator theory is an empirical claim about the structure of English. Like any other scientific theory, it not only needs to account for all the evidence, it also needs to outperform its rivals with regard to secondary virtues, such as overall simplicity. The worry is that the operator theory might end up like Ptolemaic cosmology: able to account for the same evidence as the Copernican system, but unable to match its simplicity. Brogaard does not alleviate these concerns; in fact, she repeatedly praises the elegance of quantificational theories.

Another question is how the defense of the operator theory supports Brogaard's earlier claims that the contents of utterances and beliefs are temporal propositions, and vice versa. Different tokens of the same tensed sentence can have different truth-values if they occur at different times, but this alone does not show that the proposition expressed is temporal. Even if tenses do work like operators, it does not follow from this alone that utterance tokens of the same tensed sentence type that occur at different times always express the same proposition. We might just have to use different tensed sentences to assert the same eternal proposition at different times, say, by first using 'K(a)' and then 'PK(a)'. Nor is it obvious that the contents of belief must always coincide with the contents of assertions. Suppose someone utters 'K(a)' at time t, but does not know what time it is. If the eternalist about the content of assertion is right, then this utterance asserts that a is K at time t. However, the utterer clearly does not believe this; not every belief at a time is a belief about that that time. It seems that even an honest agent can sometimes fail to assert what she believes, or fail to believe what she asserts.

For the most part, Brogaard combines these various theses by stipulation. On page 5, she presents a list of claims about propositions advocated by Gottlob Frege, which includes the claim that propositions are the contents of assertions, that they are the objects of belief and other attitudes, and that they are the contents that certain sentential operators operate on. Brogaard's temporalism holds that all of these Fregean theses are true of temporal propositions as well. As far as I can tell, the only point at which she tries to establish a connection between the different components of temporalism occurs in Chapter 6, where she argues that temporal operators like 'P' and 'F' need some content to operate on, and that this content must be propositional content, which only temporal propositions can provide. I think the overall case of the book could have been strengthened by a more explicit account of the relation between the various claims Brogaard defends.

This review focused on a few open questions and some issues that I wish Brogaard had addressed in more detail, but these concerns should not detract from the overall merits of the book. Transient Truths is a welcome addition to the philosophical literature that is bound to reignite the discussion about the temporal features of propositions.