Transitional Subjects: Critical Theory and Object Relations

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Amy Allen and Brian O'Connor (eds.), Transitional Subjects: Critical Theory and Object Relations, Columbia University Press, 2019, 269pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231183192.

Reviewed by Claudio Corradetti, University of Rome, Tor Vergata


The first generation of Frankfurt School theorists was particularly keen on adopting psychoanalytic concepts to unveil social pathologies of capitalist societies. The intellectual appeal of these beginnings was based on Lukács' and Marx's preoccupations with socially spoiled relations as well as with subjects' deformations towards object relations. Philosophy and social theory proceeded together with object relations psychoanalysis. The outer self, individual or collective, mirrored an inner self. The reality principle played a constituting function for the transitional detachment of the original symbiotic unity of the subject with the mother. Pathologies of world production (alienation, domination, commodification, reification processes, ideological superstructures and so on) are pathologies of a diminished self, a subject uncreatively forced to cope with an (apparently) unmodifiable world. Should the working class passively accept capitalist labor exploitation? Will it ever become aware of reifying mechanisms of social production? The economic world, the psyche and the ideological superstructure are all interdependent components that provide a critical bite to social theory. Philosophical anthropology, psychoanalysis and so on all fall within the horizon of the intellectual resources for immanent social analysis, a perspective profoundly set aside in later Critical Theory developments.

It is from this intellectual legacy that the work of the British pedagogue Winnicott gained momentum in Axel Honneth's theory of recognition. Psychic impoverishment due to interpersonal misrecognitions is social dynamics deeply rooted in object relations analysis. For Freud, an 'object' was basically an object of desire already active in a child's sexual drive (Trieb) whose repression generates anxiety due to a sense of abandon by the parental caretaker (not to speak of impulses of aggressiveness). Object relations raise unhappy feelings and, ultimately, pathological selves even when they are not interpreted in terms of Klein's death drive.

These and other similar themes are the center of discussion in this collection edited by Amy Allen and Brian O'Connor. The book is organized into three parts following a general introduction. The first part comes under the heading 'Conceptual Foundations', the second under 'Historical Encounters', and the third under 'Political Implications'. Throughout the chapters there unfolds not only an internal debate on conceptual issues -- mainly discussing Honneth's interpretation of Winnicot's transitional objects, etc. through other authors' perspectives -- but also the reconstruction of historical figures who have contributed in different ways to applying or taking a distance from Freud's object relations. This Freudian notion is connected to the pre-oedipal phase from which transitions follow. Several of the contributors further Freud's object relation theory by engaging, among others, with Klein's theory of the death drive. There are a number of significant essays that would be worth considering, but which I cannot present here adequately. They include Allen's discussion of Freud/Klein philosophy of history and death drive (confronting Freudian pessimism and Klein's maintenance of ambivalence of eros/death as a progressive solution), Owen Hulatt's discussion of 'transitional objects' (with regard to 'commodity form'), Johanna Meehan's analysis of Jessica Benjamin's theory of recognition and destruction and others which I cannot present here adequately.

Rather than attempting to provide a survey of all the contributions, I will detail only some of the topics in the book. I will focus on specific topics in the opening sections, particularly on the dialogue between Honneth and Joel Whitebook entitled: "Fusion or Omnipotence?" In this on-going debate (this essay is the most recent addition to that debate), reference is made to Freud's 'original psychical situation'. Depending on whether the idea of an original symbiosis of the infant with the mother, or a concept of omnipotence is adopted, a significantly different interpretation of social aggressiveness and intersubjectivity follows.

Is primary infancy object-related or rather characterized by dominance of thought and narcissism according to Freud's unsocial anthropology? Whitebook believes that "Freud's theory of primary narcissism must be criticized" (p. 27). The baby is not only a primarily object-related entity but also, as Habermas thought, a linguistic subject all the way down (meaning that there is no space granted to 'prelinguistic unconsciousness'). For Whitebook, Winnicot was the first to articulate this view when defining the relational tie between the mother and the child (by use of the metaphor of the chicken and the egg). However, Whitebook also believes that countertransference and Mead's theory of interaction are now well accepted views that no one would dare to criticize in their fundamental principles. More importantly, Whitebook observes that Winnicot did not reject the view of omnipotence, considering its relational aspect compatible: "the baby is omnipotent and dependent" at the same time. Primary growth is oriented since the start to the realization of a "reality acceptance" (p. 32).

Such duplicity of directionality, which reminds some of the Kantian anthropological views attached to the 'unsocial sociability' concept, leaves the problematic relation between the individual and the collectivity purposively unsolved. The early Frankfurt school indeed refused accommodating solutions to the two dwelling individual and collective poles. On the contrary, according to Whitebook, more recent Frankfurt developments have tried to come to terms with such opposition, as with the Habermasian astute appropriation of Mead's idea that individuation requires socialization and socialization needs individuation. The problem that arises, though, is that individuality requires safeguarding from the violent potential of society.

It is precisely at this juncture that Honneth recognizes that 'unconscious drives' cannot be expelled from a critical understanding of the subject. Is he suggesting to move with Freud beyond Freud? That seems to be Honneth's purpose when he signals how many relational ties are manifested by the baby since the early period of life. For Honneth analyzing the stages of  infancy turns into reflection on the issue of the antisocial and prelinguistic self.

Criticism of primordial antisocial drives is linked to criticisms of Freud's theory of primary narcissism. This supports, in turn, Honneth's ideas of moments of primordial fusion (in agreement with Whitebook). Furthermore, and not surprisingly, for those acquainted with Honneth's philosophy, it emphasizes the strengthening of the Hegelian concept of early emotional ties -- a unification of difference -- as it occurs in the symbiotic relationship of the infant with the caretaker. This is the idea of a primary fusion which Honneth defends.

Where Honneth partially disagrees with Whitebook, however, is in his assertion that the initial moment of fusion does not include omnipotence at its core. Emotionally, fusion communicates an idea of protection, care and consideration which omnipotence obfuscates. On the contrary, for Honneth, primordial stages of development are characterized by emotionally self-fulfilling moments which lack independence (as instead will be the case with later separations that contribute to create a sense of frustration and anxiety). To be sure, even Winnicot's use of the term 'omnipotence' is for Honneth to be interpreted in the direction of fusion, that is, of "affective stages of being fused with the other" (p. 41). All pathologies of the self which can be detected in subsequent phases of development derive therefore from separation, anxiety, and ultimately, violence spreading from an initial union with the caretaker.

With regard to issues concerning the pre-linguistic self, one has to admit the capacity of the individual (from its earliest stage) to establish a distinction between itself and the world. For Honneth, this initial process cannot be seen as accompanied by an intersubjective relation of recognition. Recognition requires autonomous subjects and, at this stage, this is far from being the case. What is instead a significant discovery following upon this point is that the infant, since its early stages, is a pre-linguistic self that is also a social self since it "places itself within the social world" (p. 43).

The union of differentiated elements appears drastically with the understanding of the I-perspective in this pre-linguistic phase. The 'I' is differentiated from the 'we' and represents a more primitive phase of all subsequent developments. The latter phases cannot but be linguistic advances. Indeed, as Honneth remarks, there is no reflexive growth without linguistic interaction. This is a point taken also by those same defenders of a concept of pre-conscious self. Nevertheless, the kernel of the subject remains that of the I-perspective of a pre-linguistic, pre-conscious self. The boundaries of the social for the individual are thus redrawn, so to speak, from within the idea of a unity of the I-perspective working in tandem with the We-perspective.

The Freudian picture lacks a consideration of a reality orientation of the infant, and accordingly it is redrawn by Honneth into Pine's sense of a reality principle influencing early cognitive orientations. More specifically, the point Honneth makes is that moments of fusion also occur alongside moments of object transitions. Thus, arousals of anxieties are explicable reactions to both dynamics of distancing and to phenomenon of rejoining of surrounding relational ties. Transitioning from objects, that is, learning about the independence of objects is at the same time a learning about the independence of the self.

The latter consideration, I believe, might be useful for understanding the book's title, Transitional Subjects. The title appears problematic since the topic of transitional subjects does not have specific thematic treatment in the collection. An indulgent reader would perhaps not be discouraged but would try to find possible interpretations to connect to 'transitional objects'.

Ultimately, the process of ‘transition’ should be considered both a reunion and a distancing of the infant to its relational objects as well as the development of a narrative of a maturing self. Contrary to apparent countertendencies, recent developments of critical theory appear well equipped for the attempt to defend the subject against overwhelming collective forces. Perhaps even more forcefully this time, the connection between individual and collective perspectives neither allows object-reifications nor substantivizes an I- or a We-perspective. Recognizing current merits of critical theory developments is to recognize that a 'critical' standpoint is still alive: and this merit should not be underestimated.