Transnationalizing the Public Sphere

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Nancy Fraser et al., Transnationalizing the Public Sphere, Kate Nash (ed.), Polity, 2014, 168pp., $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745650593.

Reviewed by Kenneth Baynes, Syracuse University


This collection offers an excellent introduction to recent discussions about the public sphere and its applicability at the global or transnational level. It will also be of interest to readers interested in the wider topic of democratization beyond the nation-state. The volume contains a lead essay by Nancy Fraser followed by five critical responses representing very different perspectives and a final reply by Fraser.

The idea of a public sphere that could serve a critical social function has been around at least since Kant. For Kant, the public sphere referred to a public reasoning about the common good among private citizens -- that is, citizens precisely not in the role of public or governmental officials -- that would serve as a check on the exercise of state power and at the same time help to rationalize that power. In his influential early work, The Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere, Jürgen Habermas traced the importance of this idea for the development of liberal democracy and its near (if not complete) eclipse with the rise of the mass media and large bureaucratic welfare state at the end of the nineteenth century. Despite his largely bleak diagnosis, Habermas continued to insist on the relevance of the bourgeois public sphere for a critical and vibrant democratic polity. In an earlier and influential essay, Fraser also critically explored Habermas's own discussion and offered some suggestions for a more inclusive and diverse understanding (in Calhoun).

In her contribution to this volume, which originally appeared in 2007, Fraser claims that most earlier work on the public sphere, including her own, did not sufficiently appreciate the challenges that globalization posed for the critical function of the public sphere. Put briefly, if the nation-state no longer serves the same role it (at least) claimed for itself as both a sovereign power and the proper site of democratization, then it is also not obvious that the public sphere can serve its same function. In a "post-Westphalian" era, the nation-state may not be in a position unilaterally to secure the interests of its citizens and, at the same time, may be threatened with respect to whatever democratic legitimacy it previously claimed. Further, if transnational institutions have assumed some of the functions ascribed to the nation-state, then that fact may call for the development of a public sphere at that level as well.

Fraser goes on to identify several presuppositions of the public sphere that were more or less taken for granted by Habermas and others: the public sphere is correlated with the modern nation-state that exercises near sovereign power over a limited territory; the participants in the public sphere were, and understood themselves to be, members of a bounded political community; the topic or subject matter for the public was the common good of this bounded political community; and, finally, the media of communication for this public sphere was (at least in principle) available to all within its territory, and assumed a single shared language and a more or less homogeneous political culture. The basic idea, then, was that a mobilized public would bring about a public opinion that could serve to legitimate state power (by providing it with core thematic issues) and hold it accountable. Earlier criticisms, including her own, focused primarily on two aspects: what she called the "legitimacy critique" questioned how inclusive the model was in terms of acknowledged participants in the public sphere; and what she called the "efficacy critique" questioned whether the mobilized public was in fact able to exercise such control over state power (rather than being subject to manipulation by it).

Fraser argues that changes brought about by globalization have profoundly called into question all of these presuppositions (even while granting that they were never wholly realized before). Global finance and capital have further weakened the traditional idea of sovereignty, and other global challenges (including, perhaps most notably, the environment) are arguably not best addressed within the Westphalian framework. At the same time, it is also not obvious that the interested public is best identified with a territorially-centered demos or that those relevantly affected by political decisions are confined to citizens of a nation-state (see Abizadeh). These changing realities require a re-examination of our understanding of the public sphere and how it might continue to exercise its critical function. Arguing that a critical theory of the public sphere must take its lead from a diagnosis of the present situation, Fraser points in particular to the emergence of a transnational public sphere, largely (though not exclusively) in connection with an expanding global civil society (see Scholte; Baynes). However, she also argues that if this transnational public sphere is to assume any of the critical tasks of its domestic counterpart, much work remains to be done. Perhaps most interesting, in this essay she seems to embrace more clearly than in her earlier critique of Habermas's own "two track" conception of a public sphere where there is a clear division of labor between the informal "weak" public located in civil society and responsible for generating public opinion and a "strong" public responsible for accountable decision-making:

It [a critical conception of the public sphere] must consider the need to construct new addresses for public opinion, in the sense of new, transnational public powers that possess the administrative capacity to solve transnational problems. The challenge, accordingly, is twofold: on the one hand, to create new, transnational [strong] public powers; on the other, to make them accountable to new, transnational [weak] public spheres. (33)

The five critical replies to Fraser represent a wide range of perspectives. Nick Couldry wonders whether globalization has disrupted the more traditional function of the public sphere to the extent that Fraser suggests (50). If not, then there may be possibilities for its development short of the more radical proposals she makes. More specifically, he suggests that rather than "transnationalizing" the public sphere, we might consider a "transnationalized" public sphere in which the still largely state-centered public sphere widens its topics or subject-matter. What he has in mind, in contrast to Fraser, is thus not so much the extension of the public sphere at the transnational level, but rather a broadening of the themes with which existing domestic public spheres concern themselves. On his view, Fraser's proposal is excessively utopian.

In a similar vein, Kate Nash also expresses some reservations about directly translating Habermas's "two track" model at the transnational level in the way Fraser proposes (65). Despite her important criticisms of the "Westphalian" presuppositions behind the model of the public sphere, according to Nash, Fraser still assumes a fairly strong Rousseauian notion of popular sovereignty in her claim that weak publics must find expression in, and hold accountable, strong publics with decision-making powers. As an alternative response to the "efficacy critique" above (that such global institutions are largely not accountable) Nash stresses the idea of what she calls "transnational advocacy networks" (or TANS) that might help make international organizations (or IO's) more accountable. The important idea behind TAN's -- which include the vast array of NGO's -- is not that they themselves constitute inclusive democratic publics (since they are in fact often not) but that they help hold IO's accountable to a basic list of human rights. In this respect, Nash also draws upon Fraser's earlier emphasis on the role of subaltern and counter-publics.

From a quite different perspective, but one that also draws upon aspects of Fraser's earlier critique of Habermas, Fuyuki Kurasawa expresses reservations about arguments for developing more formal institutions of democratic decision-making at the transnational level (or "strong publics"). As Fraser is aware, unlike Habermas's analysis of the public sphere, which had the advantage of tracking developments in the nation-state that had already occurred, Kurasawa points out that in Fraser's proposal normative intuitions are largely preceding the development of actual institutions and so, arguably, it harbors a more utopian dimension (80; and 131). In contrast to that vision Kurasawa advocates a more "anarchist-inspired model of cosmopolitanism" which stresses the role of counter-publics that challenge administrative power (rather than legitimate it) (80).

Kimberly Hutchings probes some of the deeper theoretical assumptions of Fraser's essay and, in particular, challenges some of its modernist commitments. According to Hutchings, although Fraser rightly questions some of the Westphalian assumptions of the traditional public sphere, she does not go far enough. In particular, in suggesting that the effects of globalization have called into question the idea of an active citizenry able to mobilize public opinion in a way that would tame and rationalize the state, Fraser seems to overlook that this situation is "new" only for a relatively privileged few. For most people, globalization is simply the latest form to the experience of having their lives largely controlled by others. As Hutchings sees it, Fraser does not go far enough in her critique and must further question the assumptions of "bourgeois subjectivity" that inform so much of modernist thought. This would, however, require the development of a new "social imaginary" that did not obscure the fact that most citizens of the world are not free and equal subjects in the way Fraser supposes (106).

Finally, David Owen explores some of the normative features of Fraser's understanding of the public sphere. In its initial (2007) version, Fraser's essay appealed to the "all-affected principle" according to which all those (potentially) affected by a decision should have a voice in that decision (see note, p. 34; and Fraser 2009)). As Owen points out, Fraser now thinks this principle faces some formidable objections. On the one hand, it would seem to give everyone voting rights (since anyone might be potentially affected in some way by a decision); at the same time, according to her, most attempts to circumscribe those potentially affected have been too "empirical" or rely uncritically on "mainstream social science" (118). As an alternative, she now proposes the narrower "all-subjected principle" according to which all those who are subject to a regime of governance "have moral standing as subjects in relation to it" (Fraser 2009, 65). Such moral standing implies either "equal consideration" or "participatory parity" or both (Fraser 2009, 66). Owen examines both principles: on the one hand, he thinks that the "all-affected principle" can be defended against some of the standard objections; and, on the other hand, he thinks the "all-subjected principle" faces some significant challenges of its own. For example, what rights, if any, might be claimed by those who live in a "wild zone" where there are arguably no regimes of governance in force? (122) He concludes that a critical theory may therefore have to make use of both principles.

In her reply, Fraser briefly but ably responds to her critics. She suggests that the proposals of Couldry and Nash do not go far enough in responding to the challenges of globalization: we need, she argues, transnational publics that extend beyond the boundaries of the nation-state and that are capable of holding transnational public powers accountable. However, on her view this requires more extensive democratization as well. She also, in my opinion, defends a basically Habermasian (and fundamentally modernist) understanding of a "two-track" public sphere against the criticisms of Kurasawa and Hutchings, without however denying the important role for counterpublics as well. Thus, she argues not only that there is evidence that weak and strong publics have begun to emerge at the global level, but also that there is a need for further extension of both. Finally, she suggests that the "all-subjected principle" can be defended, especially if we grant that there is something close to a global regime of governance (or, to use more Rawlsian language, a global basic structure) in place today.

Not surprisingly, the essays raise many further questions. For example, Fraser says little about the institutional form required for her particular blend of a weak and strong transnational public sphere. She suggests at one point that all those who are subject to a regime of governance are "entitled to participate in collective processes of opinion and will formation concerning the matters they regulate" (150). In Habermas's terminology, "opinion-formation" refers to the informal and "weak" publics of civil society, while "will-formation" refers to the "strong" publics directly tied to institutions of formal decision-making. This parallels her suggestion elsewhere about the need for "transnational public powers that possess the administrative capacity to solve transnational problems" (33) and would seem to require a very demanding form of institutional cosmopolitanism. But she otherwise remains relatively non-committal about the more precise institutional form this combination should take (see 150). It would seem to leave open, for example, whether accountable global governance could be more confederal, federal or polycentric in form (to draw upon a recent typology by Archibugi et al.). Questions also remain about her call for greater transnational democratization: Is the all-subjected principle -- which seems to require participatory parity for all -- best understood as expressing a basic human right to democracy because of its intrinsic value or does it rather reflect the conviction that greater democratization is the best means for achieving social justice? If the latter, arguments of the sort found in Nash's essay (that less democratically organized TANs might be more "useful" or effective for justice) would also require greater attention. Nonetheless, the collection provides a valuable introduction to recent discussions about the global or transnational public sphere, and Fraser's important contribution in particular.

Abizadeh, Arash. "Democratic Theory and Border Control," Political Theory 36 (2008), 37-65.

Archibugi, Daniele, Mathias Koenig-Archibugi and Raffaele Marchetti, eds., Global Democracy: Normative and Empirical Perspective (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2012).

Baynes, Kenneth. "Making Global Governance Public?" in Territories of Citizenship, ed. by E. Erman and L. Beckman (New York: Palgrave MacMillan, 2012), pp. 123-145.

Calhoun, Craig, ed. Habermas and the Public Sphere (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1992).

Fraser, Nancy. Scales of Justice (New York: Columbia University Press, 2009).

Scholte, Jan Aart , ed. Building Global Democracy?: Civil Society and Accountable Global Goverance. (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2011).