Transparency and Self-Knowledge

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Alex Byrne, Transparency and Self-Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2018, 227pp., $40.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198821618.

Reviewed by Jared Peterson, State University of New York-Oswego


How do we know what we believe, want, intend, or feel? In other words, how do we come to possess knowledge of our own minds? One historically influential answer to this question is that we know the contents of our minds via introspection. We "look inward" to determine what mental states we token. And when all goes right, we have self-knowledge that is both epistemically secure, and arrived at in a manner no one else can use to know the fact in question.

Alex Byrne's book is an ambitious defense of the view that the above explanation of how we possess such knowledge gets things backwards -- instead of looking inward to know our minds, we "look outward" at features of the world. Such an approach to self-knowledge -- which we can call the transparency approach -- has its fair share of advocates. What distinguishes Byrne's work, however, is his unique explanation of how looking outward affords us self-knowledge, an explanation that makes his work an important contribution to the literature on self-knowledge.

Before discussing Byrne's novel approach to transparency, it bears mentioning that he devotes the first half of his book to criticizing alternative views of self-knowledge. And while I worry that some of the ground-clearing work he does fails to clear the appropriate ground, the clarity with which he discusses a number of the most influential theories of self-knowledge makes his book especially valuable for those new to the literature on self-knowledge.

Byrne's favored approach to self-knowledge involves positing that we know the contents of our minds by following (or trying to follow) epistemic rules that take the following general form:

If conditions C obtain, then believe that p.

In the case of epistemic rules involving self-knowledge, 'C' will (in the typical case) be conditions involving the external world, and 'p' will be a proposition about one's mind. The fact that C will be conditions involving the external world is supposed to explain why the knowledge acquired via following such a rule is transparent in nature -- we attends to features of the (external) world in order to determine what our psychological states are.

Less abstractly, to take the account Byrne spends the most time developing, an agent S knows what she believes, according to him, via the following rule:

BEL: If p, believe that you believe that p

where 'p' is a proposition about the world. Given that p is a proposition about the world, on Byrne's view we investigate the world to know what we believe.

Similarly, we know what we want, according to Byrne, via the following epistemic rule:

DES: If Ф-ing is a desirable option, believe that you want to Ф.

Once again, the thought is that we look outward to the world (in this case, to the desirable features of the phenomenon in question), to learn about our minds.

Byrne understands that the idea that we acquire self-knowledge via following rules such as BEL and DES seems puzzling. It is not, after all, obvious how attending to non-psychological facts about the world outside our minds enables us to acquire knowledge about our psychological lives. How, for example, does attending to the fact that Sacramento is the state capital of California explain my knowledge of my belief that Sacramento is the state capital of California? To make the same point more formally, Byrne suggests that we know what we believe via reasoning in accordance with the following schema:


I believe that p.

But reasoning in accordance with this schema seems patently flawed. So, as Byrne acknowledges, he owes an explanation of how we acquire knowledge of our beliefs via such an inference.

Byrne's unique answer to this question is that following BEL involves believing that one believes that p because one recognizes (and hence knows) that the antecedent obtains. But if one recognizes and hence knows that p, then one believes that p. So following BEL ensures that one's belief that one believes that p will be true. BEL is thus a rule that when followed produces extremely reliable, safe beliefs (i.e., beliefs that are not likely to be false). In Byrne's terminology, BEL is self-verifying.

Now one can try to follow BEL and not succeed in following this rule. Doing so involves merely believing that p where the belief in question fails to amount to knowledge because p is false. But, as Byrne notes, one interesting feature of BEL is that even if one does not succeed in following BEL, as long as one tries to follow the rule, one's second-order belief about what one believes will be true. This is because trying to follow BEL entails believing that the antecedent of BEL obtains. And that, of course, will (in almost all cases) ensure that one's second-order belief is true. BEL, in Byrne's terminology is also, then, strongly self-verifying.

Despite the shrewdness of the proposal, there are a number of concerns one might have with it. Perhaps the most pressing of these -- one Byrne considers in response to the work of Boyle (2011) -- is the worry that his view fails to explain how we have knowledge of our beliefs because the inferential process in question is misguided. To see why one might think this, consider that Byrne's account entails that we acquire knowledge of our beliefs by making a flawed inference[1] from a premise that serves as poor evidence for the conclusion. The lone worldly premise we base our belief about our beliefs on does not even make probable the truth of the conclusion (in the typical case), let alone entail it.

Consider: the fact that the world's tallest living human is 8' 3" tall does not entail or even make probable that one believes the tallest living human is 8' 3" tall.

Now if our evidential base for the second-order belief in question is that we accept p as true, then this would constitute good evidence for the second-order belief. But then, of course, our real grounds for believing that we believe that p is not p, but our belief that p. To recognize that we believe that p is to possess self-knowledge of what we believe. But this is to assume that the explanandum of Byrne's account has already been explained. It would also entail that Byrne's transparency account is not really transparent after all.

The worry, in short, is that Byrne's epistemology of belief posits that we engage in flawed reasoning from poor evidence as the (typical) means by which we acquire knowledge of our own beliefs. And one might think such faulty reasoning on the basis of poor evidence does not yield knowledge.

Byrne acknowledges that on his view one's second-order beliefs are not supported (in the typical case) by adequate evidence. But he claims that this should not prevent us from thinking that such beliefs fail to amount to knowledge; such beliefs are, after all, safe beliefs. And such safety, he suggests, suffices to afford us knowledge. He further suggests that if one gets reflective and realizes that her second-order belief is based on inadequate evidence, her self-knowledge need not be "demolished" by such a realization. This is because she can recognize that the inference in question is a good one, in the sense of being knowledge-conducive.[2]

I imagine, though, that Boyle et al. will not (despite Byrne's efforts) think agents can recognize this. They will maintain that BEL is not a knowledge-conducive rule. And in defense of their resistance, it does seem problematic that on Byrne's view we can (a) be aware of the fact that our sole grounds for the second-order belief that we token a particular belief B is poor evidence for that second-order belief, (b) be aware of the fact that the inference we make in believing that we token B is flawed, and yet (c) still possess knowledge that we token B. One is tempted to say that whatever knowledge is, when (a) and (b) are met, we do not have it.

Relatedly, one might also wonder why we should believe that, in the typical case, we actually do follow (or try to follow) BEL. After all, Byrne does not just want to claim that we can possess self-knowledge of our beliefs by following BEL, but that this is the typical way we come to possess self-knowledge of our beliefs. Byrne, however, provides little defense of the claim that we do in fact follow (or try to follow) BEL. The issue is all the more pressing given the fact that if we reason in accordance with BEL we consistently engage in flawed reasoning where our sole evidential base is (typically) poor grounds for our second-order belief. Is it really the case that we engage in this type of fallacious reasoning from problematic evidence on a regular basis? One, it seems, would hope not.

As implied above, Byrne thinks we follow (or try to follow) epistemic rules that take a similar conditional form as BEL in order to possess self-knowledge of states other than belief, including: (i) factive or object-entailing states, (ii) sensations, (iii) pro-attitudes, and (iv) emotions. Arguably the most controversial views Byrne advances concerns his epistemology of (ii). This is not surprising given that it is commonly thought that sensations are the most plausible candidates of states we know by looking inward, not outward. It is therefore worth examining Byrne's epistemology of sensations, one he confines to a discussion of our self-knowledge of (the feeling of) pain. Doing so will require a slight detour into Byrne's views on the metaphysics of pain.

Byrne holds that pains are disturbances of the body that are located in the part of the body being disturbed. Pains, qua disturbances of the body, on his view, are distinct from feelings of pain. Additionally, Byrne adopts a version of the perceptual theory of pain, according to which one has dedicated receptors for detecting disturbances to the body. Such receptors send signals to the brain to enable it to know a part of its body is being disturbed. When one is in pain, on this view, one "perceives" disturbances to the body via the receptors dedicated to pain -- viz., by way of what Byrne, following Sherrington (1906), calls "nociceptors." According to Byrne, just as the external world is revealed to us by dedicated mechanisms for transducing light and sound, "the world of pain" or disturbances to the body is revealed to us by nociception. And the latter world, he thinks, is just the totality of "p-facts" concerning qualities of painful disturbances to bodies, facts that can be symbolized as "[ . . . x . . . ]p", where 'x' is a disturbance of the body.

With this apparatus in place, Byrne proposes that we know we feel a pain via conforming to the following rule:

PAIN: If [ . . . x . . . ]p, believe that you feel a pain.

Similarly, he thinks we know we feel a pain in our foot via the following rule:

PAIN-FOOT: If [ . . . x . . . ]p, and x is in your foot, believe that you feel a pain in your foot.

Following the above rules is supposed to afford us with transparent knowledge of the feeling of pain, I take it, because in making a judgment about x we are making a judgment about an internal disturbance to our body, not a judgment about anything happening in our minds.

But even if one accepts Byrne's contentious claims about the metaphysics of pain, there is still a worry about how we know, in a transparent-friendly manner, that the antecedent of the above conditionals obtain. In other words, there is a worry concerning how we recognize (or for that matter, why we would even come to believe) that the fact in question is a p-fact (i.e., a fact about the world of pain), as opposed to some other type of fact.[3] The explanation that it is nociception and nociception alone that makes us aware of p-facts does not put to rest this worry, because we would then want to know how we recognize that the fact in question is a deliverance of nociception.

Now it strikes me that the simplest explanation of how we know the fact in question is a p-fact is on the basis of the felt quality or phenomenology of pain, i.e., the feeling of pain. But if this is correct, then what needs to be explained is already assumed to have an explanation. We know the antecedent obtains because we are aware of the feeling of pain.

Byrne might respond to the above objection by claiming that p-facts wear their p-ness on their sleeve, so to speak. But a reasonable rejoinder to this suggestion, it seems, is that if such facts do wear their p-ness on their sleeve, this is because of the phenomenology we associate with such facts. And this again just seems to presuppose an awareness of the feeling of pain as the way we recognize (or even believe) that the fact in question is a p-fact.

I am skeptical, then, that Byrne has provided an adequate, transparent-friendly explanation of how we know we feel a pain.

There is certainly much more to be said about Byrne's views on self-knowledge, and in particular more to be said concerning his epistemology of (i), (iii) and (iv) above. (That there is speaks to the richness and extensiveness of his work.) But it is fair to say that if one is skeptical of Byrne's approach to the self-knowledge of belief and sensation, one is likely to be skeptical of these other accounts as well.

I do not, however, think that we should be skeptical about Byrne's book being a valuable contribution to the literature on self-knowledge. Indeed, that it is, is one of things I hope the above discussion has conveyed. It is also a fun book to read for multiple reasons (e.g., its lively prose, the ingenuity of the dialectical moves it contains, and the author's wit).

Byrne's book ends on a (refreshingly) modest note. The author claims that even if his sustained defense of the transparency approach fails, at the very least he will have inadvertently demonstrated that his theory of self-knowledge collapses under sustained scrutiny. Although I think the latter is in fact the case, that I have arrived at this conclusion is due in large part to the transparency with which Byrne presents his views.


Boyle, M. (2011). "Transparent Self-knowledge." Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 85: 233-241.

Davidson, D. (1984) "First Person Authority." Dialectica 38: 101-111.

Sherrington, C.S. (1906). The Integrative Action of the Nervous System. New York: Charles Scribner's Sons Press.

[1] It is "flawed" in the sense that the inference, or more carefully, the argumentative structure we reason in accordance with, is invalid.

[2] Byrne also makes the point that at least some of the knowledge we possess is unsupported by evidence, and that a number of philosophers (e.g., Davidson in his (1984)) think self-knowledge is a type of knowledge we have that is not based on evidence. So the fact that self-knowledge, on his view, is not supported by evidence is, according to him, a virtue of his account. But it is one thing to claim that self-knowledge is not based on evidence, and another to claim that it is the result of an inference from grounds that do not in the least make probable the truth of the conclusion.

[3] It seems clear that the mere fact that our body is disturbed would not in and of itself lead us to think that we feel a pain.