Transparent Minds: A Study of Self-Knowledge

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Jordi Fernández, Transparent Minds: A Study of Self-Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2013, 245pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199664023.

Reviewed by Lauren Ashwell, Bates College


Few works on introspective self-knowledge cover as much ground as Jordi Fernández's Transparent Minds. Many discussions of introspection stop after addressing the question of how we introspect our beliefs; Fernández goes beyond this to discuss the very interesting question of how we introspect our desires. He also applies his theory to thought-insertion and self-deception -- issues usually not considered in work on self-knowledge. Although Fernández has published quite a few papers on introspection, this book adds further argument, giving an even clearer, and more compelling, picture of his view. He has produced an enjoyable, stimulating contribution to the self-knowledge debate that is well worth reading.

Despite the broadness of his treatment of introspection, his book does not give a complete picture of the introspective method. In some sense Fernández doesn't aim to do so; the introspection of sensation, emotion, and perception are explicitly marked as outside the scope of his discussion.[1] However, he leaves open many important questions about the introspection of belief and desire. Some aspects of the model need more detail, and there appear to be cases of introspection of these attitudes that do not fit into his model -- moreover, his own account of thought insertion requires this. Although I will focus on these limitations, I think there is still much of value to be drawn from his arguments.

Fernández's account of introspection, like many others, takes its inspiration from Gareth Evans' remarks about introspection -- roughly, that in order to find out whether you believe that p, you simply ask whether p is true.[2] Fernández has a novel interpretation of Evans' insight -- that when you ask whether p, you are looking for whether you are in a state that normally causes you to believe that p. The normal cause of M he labels the ground for M. He calls his model of introspection the "bypass" model; you "bypass" looking for the mental state directly, and look for whether you are in a state that would be a normal cause of that mental state. In the case of belief, this usually involves looking for whether you have reasons for the particular belief; although Fernández's use of "grounds" is not meant to be normative, he assumes that the normal causes of belief are states that are reasons for that belief. In most cases, the normal cause of the mental state M will be the same as the normal cause for the introspective belief that you are in M. An introspective belief is justified if it in introspected on adequate grounds. Adequate grounds for a belief are grounds that tend to correlate with states of affairs that make the belief true -- so for introspective beliefs, adequate grounds will tend to correlate with your having the mental state that you believe you have. Since normal causes tend to correlate with the things they are normal causes for, introspective beliefs will be justified (although not indefeasibly) if they are formed through bypass.

In standard cases of belief introspection the bypass method gets the same results as other Evans-inspired accounts. The interesting cases for Fernández's model are ones where the normal causes of a belief are not rational causes. Consider someone whose racist beliefs are caused by emotions. Fernández uses this example (pp. 136-138) to clarify that, although in his model the same state (in this case, the racist emotion) grounds both the racist belief and the introspective awareness of it, he can accommodate the intuition that while the racist belief is not justified (it is formed on grounds that are not adequate for it), the introspective belief is justified (as the emotion is adequate grounds for the introspective belief, since it is the normal cause for the racist belief being introspected).

There are a few puzzles that arise about how the model deals with this sort of case, however. First, one might worry about how we group beliefs and causes such that the emotion gets to be the normal cause of this belief, even though emotions are not normal causes for this person's beliefs in general. Presumably Fernández doesn't want to end up individuating classes of introspective beliefs so finely that the normal cause of a belief that p (and thus what you look to when introspecting) is always whatever the cause actually happens to be. Second, one might also wonder about how the racist could know to look to his emotions rather than reasons when introspecting his racist beliefs. It can't be that he does this because the introspective belief just pops into his head whenever he has the emotion -- for Fernández argues that introspection is a cognitive achievement; one must actually do something, follow some method, to introspect (pp. 28-9). He can't know to look to his emotions because he has observed a past correlation between particular emotions and the racist belief, as the emotion is supposedly his only first-personal epistemic access to the fact that he has the belief. Third, in order for the introspective belief to be justified, Fernández requires that the subject must be both capable of being aware of the state that grounds it and able to produce the grounds as justification for the introspective belief (pp. 41-3). While this subject might justify his introspective beliefs about his racism with appeal to an emotion ("I don't really have any reasons -- I just feel that that racial group is inferior"), he more plausibly would give a post-hoc rationalism, citing reasons for his belief that aren't causes. But his introspective belief doesn't seem less justified in virtue of this. Rather, he seems acutely aware of his racist views, and this awareness explains why he confabulates his reasons for the racist beliefMoreover, it may be that we all make mistakes in identifying the causes of many of our beliefs,[3] and this would have the counterintuitive consequence that we're not justified in our introspective knowledge of these beliefs.

Another interesting case is the one that occurs when you forget your reasons for a belief. According to Fernández, I can still justifiably introspectively believe that, for example, I believe that Stumptown coffee has a good reputation (despite having forgotten why I formed this belief). Instead of looking to my original reasons, the introspective belief is formed on the basis of my experience of seeming to remember that Stumptown coffee has a good reputation (see p. 55). But it isn't clear to me that this example fits the general model; my seeming to remember is certainly not the initial cause of the belief, and it seems disputable whether it is a sustaining cause of the belief. Instead, it seems to be caused by the belief -- I seem to remember that Stumptown Coffee has a good reputation because I believe this. Now, one could argue that my memory experience must be the cause of my belief, as even though I had the belief before forming the apparent memory, now the apparent memory causally sustains the belief. Or else claim that although I can't recall the reasons I believe this, memory has in some sense preserved the dispositions associated with these reasons.[4] But a more plausible response, I think, is to loosen the requirement that it in introspecting you must look to the mental state's cause -- to simply require that you introspect via looking to a state that is reliably causally connected to the mental state being introspected. Perhaps sometimes we form justified introspective beliefs by looking to the causal effects downstream of the mental state. Such a move would also, I think, improve Fernández's view about desire introspection, while still respecting the general motivations for the view.

Fernández gives a parallel account of desire introspection (ch. 3): to introspect whether you desire that q, you look to whether you are in a state that normally causes you to desire that q. He identifies three types of normal causes of desire for a desire that q: valuing q, having a desire that r and a belief that r would be the case if q were the case, and what he calls an "urge" -- having the experience of not-q as unpleasant. This extension of his account to desire is more plausible than many other attempts to extend accounts that were developed by thinking mostly about belief.

However, the requirement that we introspect by looking for normal causes of a mental state seems too restrictive; Fernández's "urges" seem like they might sometimes be caused by the desire rather than being the cause of it. When I experience it as being unpleasant that I am not watching the T.V. show that I'm currently addicted to, this unpleasantness seems to be due to my wanting to watch it, together with the fact that I'm not satisfying that desire. But if having the desire causes the experience of unpleasantness through which I introspect the desire, then this is not introspecting through bypass. Perhaps Fernández will claim that in this case my introspective belief is formed on the basis of a desire to do things I enjoy, and a belief that watching T.V. is a way of satisfying that desire. But the apparent strength of this particular desire is better matched by how unpleasant I find it to withhold than how pleasant I think it would be to satisfy it -- so an important fact about the desire is introspectively known in virtue of something that is causally downstream of the desire.

Chapter 5 on thought insertion also leaves crucial questions unaddressed. Fernández argues that the central features of thought insertion are best explained by the subjects' introspective beliefs not exerting the kind of "pressure" that our usual introspective beliefs exert on us to (presumably, continue to) occupy the mental state seemingly introspected. This, he thinks, explains why the subjects feel that the thoughts that they seem to be aware of are not theirs -- there is "awareness without ownership" (p. 145). Introspective beliefs formed through bypass, as he argues in his chapter on Moore's Paradox (ch. 4), supposedly do exert this pressure -- unlike beliefs about our mental states formed through, for example, inference from observations of our behavior. But this means that the story requires some account of how these subjects become aware of these inserted thoughts, as it is not through bypass.

We might also wonder if some of our ordinary introspective beliefs might be formed through this different method, as there do seem to be cases -- particularly for desire -- where we don't feel pressure to occupy (or continue to occupy) a mental state that we introspectively believe we have. Someone who introspects a desire that they are disgusted by, or ashamed of, or that they think is irrational -- that they judge they ought not to have -- does not seem to feel pressure to continue to occupy the state in question when they introspect. Why then do they not necessarily feel like the desire is "inserted"? It is true that sometimes we think of desires like this as "coming over us," and perhaps we sometimes think of them as not really being our own. But such claims of non-ownership feel far more metaphorical than those made by people who experience thought insertion.

Fernández's views on self-deception (ch. 6) seem more developed. He argues that a person who is self-deceived is making a mistake of self-knowledge. The self-deceived misogynistic philosopher (p.184) who claims that he believes that women are not inferior at philosophy, although his actions suggest otherwise, has formed the introspective belief that he does not believe that women are inferior, although he in fact has that belief. The first-order belief explains his sexist behavior -- e.g., that he has never been in favor of hiring a woman, that he is dismissive of work published by people with feminine-gendered names -- and the second-order belief explains his reports about his belief. So, Fernández argues, his account can explain how often the self-deceived may act in conflicting ways, as sometimes their actions suggest that they do have a particular belief and other times their actions suggest that they don't. The model is also supposed to explain why we hold the self-deceived blameworthy for their self-deception.

It seems right to me that central cases of self-deception involve failures of knowledge about the self,[5] and they do seem to involve some introspective blindness. However, some of the cases Fernández discusses don't clearly involve failures of introspection. Consider the self-deceived misogynistic philosopher again. Fernández claims that this philosopher has the introspective belief that he believes that women are just as good at philosophy as men, because he finds no grounds to believe otherwise. But if this is how we ought to understand the case, it seems odd to me to claim that this philosopher is blameworthy for a mistake of introspection.

Now, there are plenty of ways in which this philosopher is epistemically blameworthy -- obviously mostly because he shouldn't have the sexist first-order belief, and also because he does not consider the third-personal evidence (his sexist behavior) that is available to him. But if the bypass model is correct, as he finds no grounds for the sexist belief, then he's epistemically admirable in his treatment of the first-personally available evidence, and not making an introspective mistake. Yet it still seems that he could be making a mistake of introspection -- and that this is what the self-deception consists in. Fernández might want to say that his mistake of self-knowledge was not finding the actual cause of his sexist belief. Yet unless 1) we flesh out the case to claim that this actual cause is the normal cause -- the ground -- for his sexist belief, and 2) he has made some epistemic mistake in not realizing that the actual cause is the normal cause, we can't, on Fernández's model, say that he has made a mistake of introspection.

Despite this, Fernández's discussion and evaluation of the intentional model of self-deception (where the self-deceived subject is supposed to be intentionally deceiving herself) and the motivated-by-desire model (where the self-deceived subject's desire that p causes the subject to treat evidence in a biased way so she comes to irrationally believe that p) is well-argued, and he has at least convinced this reader that there are cases of self-deception that his own model deals with better than these other models do.

So, as it stands, Transparent Minds leaves much unexplained. It is, I think, best thought of as arguing for the importance of just one particular way that we have of forming justified introspective beliefs. But that alone is an important contribution. I strongly recommend it to anyone interested in self-knowledge.

[1] Although in his 2003 article, "Privileged Access Naturalized," The Philosophical Quarterly 53(212): 352-372, Fernández gives an account of the introspection of perceptual experience that fits within the model of introspection given in Transparent Minds.

[2] Evans, Gareth. 1982. The Varieties of Reference, Oxford University Press, 225.

[3] For some examples, see Wilson, Timothy. 2009. Strangers to Ourselves. Harvard University Press.

[4] See pp. 370-371 of Fernández, Jordi. 2003. "Privileged Access Naturalized."

[5] For other arguments to this effect, see Holton, Richard. 2001. "What is the Role of the Self in Self-Deception?" The Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 101(1): 53-69.