Transplanting the Metaphysical Organ: German Romanticism between Leibniz and Marx

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Leif Weatherby, Transplanting the Metaphysical Organ: German Romanticism between Leibniz and Marx, Fordham University Press, 2016, 462pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823269419.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Millan, DePaul University


In recent years, there has been much more attention directed to the philosophical dimensions of German Romanticism, a movement that for far too long was dismissed as merely literary. The welcome result of this attention is the emergence of a richer dialogue that reveals the historical context of a movement whose leading figures included Friedrich von Hardenberg (Novalis), Friedrich Hölderlin, F.W.J. Schelling, F.D.E. Schleiermacher, and Friedrich Schlegel. We are, at long last, in a position to appreciate how much these thinkers have to offer to contemporary discussions ranging from questions of culture, art, and religion, to metaphysics, epistemology, and the natural sciences. Leif Weatherby's excellent study is a welcome contribution to the growing scholarship on the philosophical dimensions of German Romanticism, and his careful, creative work, which blends literary, philosophical, and historical analysis, will surely awaken even more interest in the field. The volume is part of the Forms of Living Series, edited by Stefanos Geroulanos and Todd Meyers, which in turn is part of the Modern Language Initiative at Fordham University Press. The editors claim that the series, "seeks to provide an outlet for theoretically and methodologically rigorous writing theorized and articulated through various disciplines, frames, and attempts" and that it "begins new conversations on what is at stake between knowledge and life in the forms that each takes."

In the three parts of Weatherby's impressive volume, which covers figures as diverse as Leibniz, Blumenbach, Kant, Herder, Hölderlin, Schelling, Novalis, and Goethe, he delivers on the promise of the series to open a new conversation about what is at stake in discussions of knowledge and life. Weatherby focuses upon the term 'organ' and uses that term to conduct a discussion centered upon life and metaphysical processes from Kant to Marx, with special emphasis on the work of the German Romantics. As he tells us early in the book, organs "take over the function of mediators between body and soul" and so "come in Romantic discourse to define being as such" (p. 2). Weatherby's skill as a reader of Romanticism is well-reflected in the work he does to defend what I take to be the most promising and innovative claim of the book, namely, that

The layer of Romantic discourse centering on the word 'organ' reveals a different Romanticism -- one focused on Critical methodology, on a new metaphysical approach to concrete scientific and political topics. The doctrine that emerges -- reconstructed here from its incomplete textual expression -- can be called 'organology' (p. 123).

Weatherby, who characterizes Schelling as "the biggest risk-taker among the German Idealists" (p. 174), is also a risk-taker. It is no timid task to reveal a new Romanticism, via a reconstruction from "incomplete textual expression." To do so via organology, described by Weatherby as a new metaphysical approach to concrete scientific and political topics, is not a task for the meek, but he does not shy away.

The book opens with an overview of how the term 'organ' was understood during the 17th century, and how a change in its meaning signaled a shift in nothing less than the notion of life itself. Weatherby locates the heart of this shift in the contributions of the Romantics, writing that, "Romantic organology was meant to be a powerful intellectual tool for the refashioning of the natural and social worlds" (p. 10). An investigation of the relation of the natural and social worlds takes Weatherby on a long and winding road through the history of ideas (and, as he emphasizes, his is a tale of intellectual, literary, scientific, and philosophical history) from Leibniz to Marx. The scope reveals his ambition, and without focus and care, such ambition could easily lead to hazy arguments and confusing jargon. When I first saw the title of Weatherby's volume, I was apprehensive about its scope. Kant taught me long ago that "thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind" (CPR, B75/A51). Painful reading experience has taught me time and again that ambition without discipline is blind, leading to works that become a string of thoughts without useful content. I am happy to report that Weatherby's ambition is matched by his discipline as a scholar: he is a clear and careful writer, a reasonable risk-taker, finding the Aristotelian mean between rashness and cowardice. His book is a fine example of intellectual bravery. His ambition is also tempered by a humility that slows him just where it should and which results in a compelling case for the claims he defends. The result is a study that illuminates and also opens the field of Romanticism in innovative ways.

In three parts: I) "Toward Organology," II) "Romantic Organology: Toward a Technological Metaphysics of Judgment," and III) "After Organology," Weatherby clarifies his terms and carefully supports his claims. The first three chapters set out a rich historical context for the problem of organology. Organology, as he goes on to argue, is a "metaphysical approach to concrete scientific and political topics" (p. 123), an approach that tells the "intertwining histories of nature-human cognition as a single theory" (p. 124). He presents the metaphysical issues related to organs and the emergence of life through a compelling discussion of the work of Leibniz, Blumenbach, Kant, and Herder. Having presented a detailed view of the organ of the soul, he then moves to a discussion of romantic organology in the four chapters that constitute the second part of his study. In his discussion of the Romantics, the works of Hölderlin, Schelling, and Novalis are highlighted and carefully analyzed. Chapter 7, "Between Myth and Science: Naturphilosophie and the Ends of Organology," is of great merit, as Weatherby here connects science and myth and presents a case for the connection between Naturphilosophie and organology, thereby shedding much needed light on what precisely thinkers of the period were after in their pursuit of Naturphilosophie, which is more than simply a philosophy of nature. In Part III, "After Organology", the final two chapters of his book, he connects the work of Hegel and Goethe and then draws our attention to contemporary connections between organology and a Marxist social critique. In what follows, I will focus on what I take to be the heart of the book, which is Part II, "Romantic Organology: Toward a Technological Metaphysics of Judgment."

At the beginning Weatherby maps his plan for the following four chapters. He frames his account of Romantic organology with the work of Hölderlin, Schelling, and Novalis. He begins Part II with the following account of the story that will unfold:

To tell the intertwining histories of nature and human cognition as a single story was the common project of Novalis, Schlegel, and the scientists who wrote what they called Naturphilosophie, the philosophy of nature. These "histories" sought to confer necessity upon contingent structures, not as a way of demonstrating their internal rationality, but as a way of gaining a theoretical toehold for intervening in these histories, for reproducing them as provisionally rational, in order to produce something radically new -- a different order of things. "Organs," then, were the locus of this philosophical hope, which combined methodology with application to the "real." Rather than producing a representation of a world, a Nature, or a history, the Romantics' focus on organs was meant to recast any possible sense of "world," "nature," or "being" (pp. 124-25).

This passage is representative of what is best about Weatherby's work and what some readers might find a bit vexing. There is a sweep of thought that is filled with insight and historical nuance to be found in the passage and indeed, throughout the volume, but there are times (and this is perhaps inevitable due to the capacious nature of the work), when some of the philosophical claims are too quick and not as developed as one (or at least I) would wish them to be. Despite any shortcomings, the story Weatherby presents is certainly worth telling. He tells new stories about Hölderlin, Novalis, and Schelling, while paying due diligence to thinkers who have told aspects of their stories before.

There is small problems with some of the historical detail. In the Introduction, as Weatherby tells us what the book will do, he makes a case for the originality of his contribution. He writes: "This book pays more attention to Kant, and especially the Critique of Pure Reason, than is usual for studies in Romanticism" (p. 30). In fact, it is quite usual for philosophers who work on Romanticism, especially, early German Romanticism, to give much attention to Kant, especially to the first Critique. Jane Kneller's path-breaking study of the Romantics, somewhat misleadingly entitled, Kant and the Power of Imagination, is a study of Romanticism that is guided by a careful analysis of Kant's work. And Manfred Frank, who Weatherby references often in his study, also has used an analysis of Kant, especially of points developed in the first Critique, to develop his account of Frühromantik.[1] Another problem concerns Weatherby's effort to take what he calls the "the ubiquitous claim that aestheticization was Hölderlin's primary move -- and that of the Romantic movement at large, especially in Jena"--and deepen and refine it (p. 25). Weatherby complains of the ubiquitous claim that Romanticism is a kind of aestheticization, but we are not given details on who is to blame for this gloss. For the most part, the book is painstakingly well-referenced, so these two unsubstantiated claims stood out in a rather glaring way.

Another reservation I had was about the term 'organology'. Throughout the book, I wondered if Weatherby really needed the clumsy term, one aesthetically at odds with the elegance of his writing, and a term that did not really add clarity to the points developed.

After his opening sweep of the topics he will explore in Part II, Weatherby goes on to give a detailed historical account of the meaning and implications of the term 'organ', connecting the contributions of Hölderlin, Schelling, and Novalis to discussions of nature, life, and force:

Hölderlin discovered the organ in the work of Samuel Thomas Soemmerring (1755-1830), who claimed that the organ of the soul lay in the waters of the nerves. Schelling united physiological debates on specific forces and their locales in the animal body to construct an electric organ at the base of human cognition, an organ containing a true contradiction, as would cognition, action, and the artifacts of the human world. Novalis's Romanticism is organology -- for him, anything can be made into an organ, one derived from polemics with Kant, borrowings from Franz Hemsterhuis, and ultimately imagining the cosmos as populated by little more than infinite potential organs (pp. 128-29).

Hölderlin, we are told, is the "inaugural thinker of Romantic organology" (p. 132), and Chapter 4, "The Tragic Task: Dialectical Organs and the Metaphysics of Judgment (Hölderlin)," provides the reader with a fascinating account of Hölderlin's work, one in which Weatherby impressively weaves together Hölderlin's poetry, his philosophical insights, and his contributions to our understanding of nature and organ. According to Weatherby's account, "the organ was made literary (genre-theoretical)" in Hölderlin's work. To support this claim, he offers detail in the form of letters between Hölderlin and oft-neglected luminaries of the intellectual period. For example, an exchange between Friedrich Immanuel Niethammer (1766-1848) and Hölderlin on the problem of intellectual intuition and the need, in Hölderlin's estimation, for a new set of philosophical letters on the aesthetic education of the human, is discussed just before Weatherby presents an exchange Hölderlin had with Schiller himself on the matter of art and philosophy. As a result of the careful historical context that Weatherby presents, Hölderlin's notion of aesthetic sense takes on greater depth, and Hölderlin's claims that art offers the infinite object of the Bildungstrieb and Kunsttrieb (p. 137) emerge in valuable, rich detail. Weatherby sheds new light on Hölderlin's dialectical thought by presenting his organology as a "metaphysics of contradiction" (p. 133). The union of opposites is Hölderlin's dialectic, and his push for a metaphysic to ground aesthetic practices (p. 136) is linked to the problem of intellectual intuition and the production of poetry (p. 146). Weatherby's moves in the context of this discussion are noteworthy because he is able to blend Hölderlin's literary and philosophical contributions into a coherent unity, something that is all too rare in work on Hölderlin. Weatherby takes a literary form, tragedy, that is central to for Hölderlin, and locates therein a wellspring of philosophical insights. He writes of Hölderlin "finding a home in tragedy for the unification of mechanical and organic orders of being; and in the tragedy itself generating actual new contradictions to construct a new world. Organology was inaugurated as the metaphysics of judgment in passage to a radical metapolitics, a theoretical or spectral Jacobinism" (p. 170). Even if I may not be able to go all the way with a claim that so quickly moves from tragedy, to orders of being, to radical metapolitics, I admire the courage of this claim, and I do believe that the tenor of such a bold claim will open new lines of investigation into Hölderlin's valuable theoretical work.

The strongest aspects of the book are found in the points on drive, nature, and life. As Weatherby indicates, the Trieb terms are biological, "formative drive is the force that forms the living being" and "artificial drive is the animal's ability to construct apparently rational things, exemplarized in the bee hive" (p. 137). He links the discussion of Trieb to Hölderlin's discussion of the limits of being and the "ocean of nature" at the center of Hölderlin's thought. While developing Hölderlin's notion of organology, Weatherby moves to a helpful discussion of the problem of intellectual intuition and the production of poetry in his work.

After the treatment of Hölderlin's role in the development of organology, and his Soemmerring-inspired search for the organ of the soul in the waters of the nerves, Weatherby turns to another spirit and nature connection, the secret band that ties our spirit to nature, namely to the hidden organ through which nature speaks to our spirit or our spirit to nature. Chapter Five, "Electric and Ideal Organs: Schelling and the Program of Organology," brings us to the role of organology in the reestablishment of Schelling's metaphysics and his view of idealism as the "real inclusion of reason in Nature" (p. 174), which is the result of doing science. As indicated above, for Weatherby, Schelling was "the biggest risk-taker among the German Idealists" (p. 171), a fact that helps explain Schelling's daring leap into the uncharted territory of Naturphilosophie. As he trenchantly tells us, "Schelling combined his risky Idealist methodology with a philosophy of nature to produce a Romantic metaphysics rooted in the term 'organ'" (p. 171). According to Weatherby, for Schelling philosophy of art is the "organ of philosophy" (p. 172). Eventually, Schelling conceives of an electric organ at the base of human cognition. Through Weatherby's careful analysis of Schelling's work, in particular his cluster of writings on nature, Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature (1797), Of the World Soul (1798), and First Outline of a System of the Philosophy of Nature (1799), we begin to see exactly how organs become the locus of the relations between forces. Life force was an important theme for thinkers writing on nature in the immediate post-Kantian period.

One great strength of Weatherby's volume is the diversity of figures included under his lens. In Chapter 5, he reminds readers that

talk of "electric organs" extended back into Enlightenment science; the British scientists Henry Cavendish (1730-1810) and John Walsh (1726-1795) debated whether the torpedo fish was possessed of such 'organs' in the 1770s. Galvani's discovery, however, intensified the physiological part of the debate, and when the controversy was at its most heated, in the 1790s, it dovetailed with the debates on life-force to produce a shift in the very concept of living. Central to this shift was Alexander von Humboldt (p. 185).

Weatherby is quite right to highlight Humboldt's role in discussions of life force. Yet, his claim that Humboldt transformed his publication, "The Rhodian Genius," a piece written for Schiller's journal, Die Horen, into a scientific program is somewhat misleading. Humboldt wrote "Vital Force or the Rhodian Genius" ("Die Lebenskraft oder der rhodische Genius: Eine Erzählung")[2] at the invitation of Schiller, but his scientific program was already well-established by 1795, the year the "Rhodian Genius" essay appeared. Hence, it is misleading to suggest, as Weatherby does, that the whimsical piece -- which even Humboldt's brother, Wilhelm found puzzling, complaining of its poetic garb -- directed his scientific program. The text is certainly one of Humboldt's most explicitly aesthetic and physiological texts, but it did not dictate his scientific program.

In Chapter 6, "Universal Organs: Novalis's Romantic Organology," Weatherby develops his claim that Novalis's Romanticism is organology, that for him, the cosmos is populated "by little more than infinite potential organs" (p. 129). He also links Novalis's organology to the political realm by way of a political organ (p. 211). In his account, the call for a new mythology is part of Novalis' push for a new social order, a new social organ. Weatherby offers an original reading of Novalis's Kant Studien, through a focus on why Novalis reads critique as an experiment and transforms pure reason into an organ. In short, he reads Novalis's organology in terms of a revision of Kant's notion of critique. He then uses his analysis to interpret some of the claims Novalis makes about Fichte's reading of Kant. In particular, Weatherby draws attention to Novalis's claim that "Fichte is the re-drafter of Kantian critique -- the 2nd Kant -- the higher organ where Kant is the lower organ . . . he sets readers down where Kant brought them up to" (p. 245). Within the careful context Weatherby lays out in Chapter 6, such enigmatic claims from Novalis make more sense; indeed, many of the philosophical moves that Novalis makes emerge with much greater clarity.

In Chapter Seven, "Between Myth and Science: Naturphilosophie and the Ends of Organology," we find an excellent account of the role of myth in the scientific program of the German Idealists and Romantics. The chapter opens with Cassirer's claim that "Myth is not simply inventing or fictionalizing but rather an organ of exposure of the historical world and the historical reality -- that is, an organ of metaphysical awareness (Towards a Metaphysics of Symbolic Forms, p. 251). At times, Weatherby's lens of organology becomes, perhaps, too expansive. For example, he tracks the tension between myth and science in the split between the humanities and the sciences and that "organs are the practical categories of radical politics" (p. 274).

The final two chapters, Chapter 8, "Technologies of Nature: Goethe's Hegelian Transformations," and Chapter 9, "Communist Organs or Technology and Organology," are each characteristically original and wide-reaching, though not tied as tightly to the previous chapters as are those of Section II. The chapter on Goethe and Hegel seems a better fit with the arguments developed in the section on Romantic Organology. Weatherby claims that the aftermath of organology is to be found in the "oblique dialogue between Goethe and Hegel" that he presents in Chapter 8. Yet, despite its detailed history of the interaction between Hegel and Goethe on the matter of "organ" and its role in science, this chapter gives the impression that Goethe was shaping the conversation about organ and science, so that his debate with Hegel was not part of the aftermath of organology, but rather part of the main story of what would become romantic organology. The move in Chapter 9 to connect organology to Marxist thought, while promising, seems to open a chapter that belongs to another study, one I hope Weatherby will soon undertake.

Weatherby's sustained attention to the "neglected doctrine" of organology is a most impressive contribution to the history of ideas, and it is a book that will certainly generate more interest in the topic of life and nature in German Romanticism. This is an ambitious, disciplined study that reveals new aspects of Romanticism: it is an invaluable reference for anyone interested in German Romanticism.

[1]See, Manfred Frank, Unendliche Annäherung. Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik (Suhrkamp, 1997), esp. Part I. Also, Frederick Beiser, "Kant and Naturphilosophie," in Michael Friedman and Alfred Nordmann, eds., The Kantian Legacy in Nineteenth Century Science (MIT Press, 2006), pp. 7-26.

[2] Weatherby has published an excellent translation of this text. See, Leif Weatherby, trans., "Life Force, or the Genius of Rhodes," Yearbook of Comparative Literature 58 (2012): 163-168.