Treatise on Consequences

Placeholder book cover

John Buridan, Treatise on Consequences, Stephen Read (tr.), Fordham University Press, 2015, 185 pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823257188.

Reviewed by Sten Ebbesen, University of Copenhagen


John Buridan (ca. 1300 - ca. 1360), master of arts at the University of Paris, wrote thoughtful commentaries on most of Aristotle's works, several of which remained influential until sometime in the sixteenth century. But, first and foremost, he was one of the greatest logicians of all times. His two main works on logic are the Summulae dialectices and the Consequentiae. The former combines traditional Aristotelian traits -- like having treatises on syllogisms, topics, fallacies and demonstration -- with medieval innovations like the theory of supposition and a treatment of sophismata. The latter is even less traditional, treating categorical syllogisms as a subclass of formally valid consequences and is, as its editor, my lamented friend Hubert Hubien († 2011), claimed, "the first attempt . . . at an axiomatic exposition of logic on the basis of the propositional calculus" (p. 61). This truly revolutionary work enjoyed a last spell of popularity among the Parisian nominalists of the late 15th century, with three printed editions appearing in the 1490s. After that, Buridan's logic was neglected for some four hundred years. By the 1970s it was time for it to return, and in 1975 a symposium on The Logic of John Buridan took place in Copenhagen.[1] One year later Hubien's excellent edition of the Consequentiae appeared in Philosophes Médiévaux XVI, and the text of the Summulae began to appear in 1994 in the Artistarium series (eight out of nine fascicles published so far). English translations have followed: of the Consequentiae by Peter King in 1985[2] and of the Summulae by Gyula Klima in 2002.[3]

Stephen Read, a leading connoisseur of late-medieval logic, in 1987 expressed dissatisfaction with King's translation of the Consequentiae.[4] Now, almost three decades later, we can see how he thinks the work should be done.

The book comprises: (a) An introduction to the contents of the work, (b) a translation of Hubien's French preface to his edition, (c) the translation, (d) brief endnotes on (a) -- (c), (e) a glossary, and finally, (f) an index of names and subjects.

Read's introduction is a useful guide to the text. It has logicians as its primary target group, pointing out both similarities to modern theories (and why one should not jump to easy equations of Buridanian and modern theories) and major differences. My only complaint is the rather weak attention paid to the historical background. Thus in an otherwise fine section (p. 11) about Buridan's notion of formal consequence as a relation holding between structurally identical propositions for all substitutions of terms, Read does compare Buridan's position with those of his two most important contemporaries, Ockham and Burley, but fails to inform the reader that the Buridanian criterion of formality was also that of Simon of Faversham some two generations earlier.[5]

Read's decision to include a translation of Hubien's French preface to the Latin text can only be applauded. The reader thus gets the argumentation for the authentiticity of the text, information about how it has been transmitted, and Hubien's arguments for 1335 as the year of composition.

Read generally keeps his English close to the Latin, avoiding the temptation to paraphrase, yet the text reads well, and he has found elegant ways round some stumbling blocks. Thus, instead of rendering potest non esse as "can not be", he uses "can fail to be", which sounds much more natural, hits the mark, and cannot be confused with "cannot be".

I admit to having studied only selected parts of the translation but on the whole they have inspired confidence. Some slightly suspicious passages and a number of randomly selected ones generally fared well when compared with the Latin text. A few slips do occur, though.

In Chapter I.1 Buridan states the causes of falsity of affirmative propositions. For a present-tense assertoric one it is quia non qualitercumque ipsa significat esse ita est, literally "that not in every way that it signifies [it to be], thus it is". Read translates "that things are not altogether as it signifies them to be", which is obviously better English, while still true to the sense of the Latin. Buridan then states the cause of falsity for the corresponding past tense propositions, which is exactly the same except that fuisse and fuit take the place of esse and est, respectively. Read similarly lets were and have been replace are and be. So far, so good, but then Buridan introduces propositions de possibili. Their causes of falsity are similarly construed, with posse esse -- potest esse in the present and posse fuisse or potuisse esse -- potuit esse in the past. This ought to yield something like "that things cannot possibly be altogether as it signifies them to possibly be" and "that things could not possibly be altogether as it signifies them to possibly have been" or "to have possibly been". Probably because of the difficulties with the verb 'can', which does not have a full range of forms, Read abandons his original formula for translating the Buridanian non qualitercumque ipsa significat INFINITVE ita INDICATIVE, and writes "that things can be other than how it signifies they can be, or could be [other than how it signifies] they could be, or could have been." But this suggests that a proposition de possibili is false if there are further possible situations than the one it describes, which there are in all de possibili propositions about contingent matters. What is required is that it be false if the situation it describes as possible is not, in fact, possible, and that is what Buridan says.

In Chapter I.2 Hubien writes Et intelligo per « causas ueritatis » alicuius propositionis <propositiones> quarum quaelibet sufficeret ad hoc quod propositio sit vera. In his introduction, p. 9, Read argues against Hubien's emendation because if the causes of truth of a proposition were propositions we would never get down to rock bottom since it would be legitimate to ask what makes those propositions true. Therefore, Read decides to drop the emendation and translates I understand by "the causes of truth" of a proposition whichever of them is enough for the proposition to be true. This is strange English, and the Latin simply will not construe without some feminine noun or pronoun in the plural in the place where Hubien inserted<propositiones>. I think Read is right in rejecting propositiones, but then we must find a replacement. I suggest causas or tales. Whichever of the two we choose, the sense becomes I understand by "the causes of truth" of a proposition such causes as would, each of them by itself, be enough for the proposition to be true. Thus, if a proposition has several causes of truth, it is not their collective effort that makes it true, for any one of them would do the trick on its own.

Generally, though, the translation stands up [6]well to scrutiny, and it is certainly no easy text to translate. Hubien's edition of the Latin text has the noble, but slightly boring, look of the volumes of Philosophes Médiévaux from the 1970s. Read's translation looks much snappier, and it has been well proof-read. May it attract more people to the study of medieval logic!

[1] Acts in J. Pinborg (ed.), The Logic of John Buridan. Acts of the 3rd European Symposium on Medieval Logic and Semantics, Opuscula graecolatina 9,  Museum Tusculanum: Copenhagen, 1976.

[2] Peter King, Jean Buridan's Logic: the Treatise on Supposition the Treatise on Consequences, Synthese Historical Library, Dordrecht, 1985.

[3] John Buridan, Summulae de dialectica. An annotated translation, with a philosophical introduction by Gyula Klima, Yale University Press: New Haven 2002.

[4] See his review of King 1985 in Vivarium 25 (1987): 154-157.

[5] See Simon of Faversham, Quaestiones su­per Libro Elenchorum,  Studies and Texts 60, PIMS: Toronto 1984, pp. 200, 202-203.