The Cambridge Companion to Popper

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Jeremy Shearmur and Geoffrey Stokes (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Popper, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 394pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521672429.

Reviewed by Abraham Stone and Paul A. Roth, University of California-Santa Cruz


The cover of this volume features a smiling visage of Popper, an image that belies the reality of the man, a harsh and unrelenting critic of all and sundry. Perhaps unsurprisingly then, Popper's philosophical heritage also proves elusive and ambiguous. For while certain signature doctrines remain firmly associated with him -- falsifiability, critical rationalism, his particular notions of an open society and historicism -- their heritage remains unclear and uncertain. Assessing these views in a larger context one would hope to be a central task of the volume under review. But such an appraisal would require negotiating between at least two relatively closed societies: that (ironically) of contemporary Popperians, and that of contemporary mainstream analytic philosophy. The essays in this volume all struggle with limited success to overcome one or the other of these obstacles, depending on whether the author is a Popperian or not.

The editors' introduction, "Popper and His Philosophy: An Overview," begins by acknowledging the contentiousness of the man and his work. This essay features a characteristic of too many of the contributions, viz., a near total failure to connect Popper's thought to closely related doctrines of other philosophers in the near temporal and intellectual space. Popper is discussed solely in relation to his own intellectual trajectory, or of those of his acolytes. This essay also emphasizes the role of fallibilism in all aspects of Popper's thought, a recurring theme in many of the essays. Yet, despite its centrality, here as elsewhere, one looks in vain for acknowledgment of criticisms and obscurities known to attend falsifiability, much less compelling responses or reformulations. To cite just one example, Kuhn receives no mention or discussion. Instead, one finds the following remark, characteristic of the apologetic tone throughout. "For various historical reasons, the virtues and utility of Popper's epistemology have not been sufficiently appreciated." (25) It marks a particularly ironic failure of those who claim to carry forward the Popperian banner to neither acknowledge nor respond to criticism on his behalf.

Malachi Haim Hacohen's "The Young Popper, 1902-1937: History, Politics and Philosophy in Interwar Vienna" offers a detailed, interesting, but ultimately puzzling picture of Popper's intellectual and personal relationships in Vienna prior to his emigration due to the rise of Nazism. In keeping with the spirit of this volume, Hacohen mentions no literature apart from that directly connected to Popper. That Popper, son of assimilated Jews in a Viennese milieu, might share certain characteristics with other intellectuals who emerged from this rarefied and powerful cultural mix receives no attention. Nonetheless, Hacohen's essay provides important insights into Popper's political development, including his early flirtation with Marxism, his intellectual debts to Leonard Nelson, and his own academic trajectory. Unfortunately, Hacohen indulges himself in intellectual asides that his otherwise informed work neither explains nor justifies. E.g.: "By narrowing down the field of inquiry and foreclosing intellectual options, Popper made philosophical breakthrough possible. But he left permanently unanswered the interesting, if intractable, questions about the interaction of logic and psychology in scientific practices." (51) But then Hacohen concludes that "Popper solved some of epistemology's most intractable problems, creating a wonderful vision of science as a rational, adventurous, progressive enterprise, a vision reuniting science and the best of traditional philosophy." (62) These two quoted remarks, if not contradictory, at least exist in tension. But this tension remains unnoticed by Hacohen and so unresolved.

Arne Friemuth Petersen's "On Popper's Contributions to Psychology as a Part of Biology" depicts Popper, the person, as a model of the Popperian epistemic virtues of "courage and imagination" (69, 77). But the expected process of making bold conjectures which must often be abandoned never seems to take place. Popper's career, according to Petersen, consists mostly of steadily accumulated insights. We are told when Popper first "realized" this or that, and about the prejudice that inhibited others from agreeing. There are indications, moreover, that Petersen has not fully taken on board the corresponding radical points of Popper's position (e.g., describing a series of psychological experiments which he, Petersen, himself carried out: "the results lend support to Popper's assumption . . . " [92]).

A single idea, not clearly emphasized by Petersen, runs through Popper's treatment of the topics he discusses, and it deserves attention. "Unlike most evolutionary thinkers who consider natural selection processes and learning processes to be of a different nature, Popper took these processes to be basically alike." (76) This could as well be described as making biology a part of psychology as vice versa. The fundamental process in both, according to Popper, is the solution of problems by trial and error. In both cases, the problem is not directly responsible for the content of any trial, but the fact that it is a problem creates selection mechanisms which eliminate ill-adapted trials, leaving behind better ones, that is, solutions. This idea is neither unique to nor original in Popper, but its full impact has yet to be felt in philosophy.

Peter Godfrey-Smith's "Popper's Philosophy of Science: Looking Ahead" exemplifies the problems faced by non-Popperian contributors to the volume. Godfrey-Smith's strategy is "to isolate and explore some parts of Popper's philosophy of science that seem to me to have continuing relevance" (105) -- in other words, his is a Whiggish history of philosophy of science, written from the point of view of the contemporary mainstream. The ideas he isolates are: (1) eliminative inference; (2) skeptical realism; (3) "pseudo-contact" between theory and observation ("genuine and intimate relationship between a theoretical idea and a piece of observational evidence" which nevertheless "has no epistemic value" because it involves no risk to the theory [110]); and (4) the diachronic perspective on evidence. In cases (1), (3), and (4), Godfrey-Smith takes something Popper thinks necessary to any rational, empirical methodology and recommends it as an extra ingredient, to be mixed into philosophy of science in moderation. This is worrying. In case (3), the "relevance" of Popper's view is even more indirect. Godfrey-Smith's real interest is to transcend the terms of a "standard debate" in which scientific realism goes together with optimism about the success of current science. "There are," he says, "two possibilities that become marginalized by this way of setting things up," but the two possibilities have little else in common. The first is Popper's (difficult and unpopular) skeptical realism, whereas the second is the (fashionable and convenient) view that "the answers to the epistemological questions that people associate with realism are complicated and field-specific" (109).

Gunnar Andersson's "The Problem of the Empirical Basis in Critical Rationalism" is largely an attempt to repair Popper's view that the statements used to test universal theories are themselves always open to further tests in the face of what Andersson takes to be serious difficulties. One problem is that Popper requires test statements to be singular existentials. This, according to Andersson, has the unacceptable consequence that "a test statement cannot be falsified by another test statement alone," since "two existential statements cannot contradict each other" (129). A second problem arises from Popper's view that no statement can be justified by experience. If universal theories can be falsified only by the unjustified acceptance of test statements, which in turn can be falsified only in the same way, then the falsification is never justified.

Popper, however, holds that a singular empirical judgment always involves an implicit universal claim. Andersson is aware of this, and discusses Popper's example ("There is a glass of water on the table"), but does not seem to notice its bearing on his problems. For Popper, the decision to accept a test statement is the decision to take it as a singular existential, whereas the possibility of testing it is the possibility of opening up its implicit universality: there never was a glass of water unless something appeared from different directions in certain orderly ways, etc. Experience motivates an unjustified settling-in-advance of implicit universals; the convention is to rest with that (unless and until a call for further testing arises).

Michael Bradie's "Karl Popper's Evolutionary Philosophy" begins by observing that Popper's "stance towards Darwinism as a scientific theory remained cautious and circumspect." (143) Bradie ably and thoughtfully documents and develops that despite apparent deep similarities between Darwinian theory and Popperian epistemology, it remains the case that "Popper's earliest view was that Darwinism and evolutionary theory were essentially tautological. He held this view . . . until the 1970s when he recanted." (153) In tracing Popper's relation to Darwinism, Bradie also provides an excellent overview of Popper's epistemology. Bradie's essay also acknowledges what many find suggestive and attractive in the broad-brush characterizations Popper himself offers about the development of knowledge, while forthrightly noting the lack of real detail precisely where any substantive case for an evolutionary account demands specifics. (166)

Nicholas Maxwell's "Popper's Paradoxical Pursuit of Natural Philosophy" offers a comprehensive review of Popper as an anticipation of Maxwell's own rethinking of contemporary physics. By 'cosmology' Popper seems to mean "the problem of understanding the world in which we live, and thus ourselves (who are part of this world) and our knowledge of it." (170, quoting Popper 1963) This echoes Quine's well-known mutual containment metaphor of epistemology and empirical psychology. But in keeping with the seemingly unspoken covenant requiring contributors not to put Popper into conversation with anyone else, this receives no mention. Although Maxwell reads Popper as a type of naturalist (172), just what could be learned will apparently be tempered by the fact that "Philosophical doctrines, even though irrefutable, can be critically assessed from the standpoint of their capacity to solve the problems they were put forward to solve." (172)

This invites if not mandates a discussion of how Popper's views fared in light of debates between Kuhn, Imre Lakatos, and Larry Laudan. But the latter two receive no mention at all and the former only a glancing reference. Rather, Maxwell declares that Popper's attempt to resurrect natural philosophy depends on his "quite fundamentally defective" (175) solution to the demarcation problem. Maxwell then devotes his essay to summarizing his own account, since "it becomes apparent that a new conception of natural philosophy is required, one that fully integrates science, metaphysics, methodology and philosophy of science in a way which is fully Popperian in spirit, even though it clashes with a number of Popper's views". (175) Judging whether Maxwell succeeds is an exercise left to the reader.

In "Metaphysics and Realism" Alan Musgrave expounds on themes for which he is well known, especially opposition both to idealism and to so-called Platonic realism. Musgrave points out, correctly, as Godfrey-Smith does, that the currently common association between realism and anti-skepticism is not necessary or even natural, and that Popper -- a skeptical realist -- is an example to the contrary. On the other hand, Musgrave remains attached to a similar association between idealism and relativism, which is no more natural: the view that different individuals (or cultures or paradigms) inhabit different and incompatible worlds is quite distinct from the view that many sets of ideas exist side by side in a single world composed entirely of ideas. Musgrave tries to motivate the connection via a brief history of idealism that ranges over Locke, Berkeley, Kant, and contemporary "constructivism." This leaves certain gaps. In any case, the upshot is that Musgrave says a lot about how his relativist opponents are implicated in idealism, and not much about Popper.

Musgrave treats Popper's doctrine about "World 3" as a watered down and incoherent form of Platonic realism. This approach is not well advised. The proper context in which to place this doctrine is not the post-Benacerraf agonizing of believers in mechanistic "causal powers" over our knowledge about things that can't push us, but rather early 20th-century discussions about the mode of being of geistig entities, as found, for example, in Dilthey, Husserl, and Carnap. To say that theories have this status is to say that, though neither physical nor psychological, they are nevertheless not "abstract" in any relevant sense: they stand in external relations -- not merely logical ones, therefore -- to each other and to other things. It's hard to say what help, if any, this provides with problems about, for example, the necessity and applicability of arithmetic truths, but consideration must begin there.

David Miller ("Popper's Contributions to the Theory of Probability and Its Interpretation") is an associate and loyal follower of Popper (and author of Critical Rationalism: A Restatement and Defence), but nevertheless one who has done much of his work in, and confines himself here to, technical and quasi-technical areas in which Popperians and others find more than the usual common ground. This tends to put him in a less defensive posture than some of the other contributors. There is also more room for him to acknowledge the efforts of non-Popperians. Indeed, Miller's broad and relatively generous discussion of the technical literature seems useful in its own right.

Since these are technical or quasi-technical areas, they are areas in which true expertise is possible, and we must admit to being no experts. An expert might find most of what Miller writes either obvious or plainly mistaken; to us, at least, much of it seemed neither.

In his discussion of the propensity interpretation, Miller's aim is to trace the steps by which Popper moved from a view close to frequentism to one in which "propensities" are understood as features of individual, unique possible events. Unfortunately, Miller has only the following to say about what can possibly be meant by the various assertions in question:

Whether we can make decent sense of such propensities depends on the vitality of our imagination. There may be some self-deception involved, but I think that I understand how, if offered a bowl of mixed fruit, I may have a rather strong inclination, short of compulsion, to choose a pitahaya, but may spontaneously choose a rambutan. (240)

But the difficulty in understanding "I may spontaneously choose . . . ," where this means that some outcome depends on me (I choose it), but not according to any law, is a difficulty of conceivability, not imaginability. How can the concept of dependence be coherently applied here? From the point of view of transcendental logic, then, Miller's discussion is unsatisfying. On the other hand, there is interest in Miller's brief discussions (237, 241-2, 244) of the relationship between propensities and frequencies, and in particular of the way a propensity interpretation leaves open a role for observations of frequency in testing

On axiomatization, the most interesting point to us was the strength of Popper's axioms. The axioms are stated in terms of a set S on which two operations, one binary and one unary, are defined, and a function p : S x S → R, intended to represent relative probability.  The axioms are sufficient to show that p takes values between 0 and 1 (in particular that 0 ≤ P(a, c) ≤ p(b, b) = 1 for a, b, c in S) and that S under the operations in question is a Boolean algebra. 

This is not a new result, as Miller's citations make clear, but it was new to us, as were its two alternative uses, namely, Popper's and Miller's, in which Boolean algebra is "the semantics appropriate to a probabilistic theory of syntax," and that of Hartry Field, Hugues Leblanc, and others, in which it is "the syntax for which the theory of probability provides the appropriate semantics" (252). The second route leads to a probabilistic interpretation of the logical connectives, whereas the first leads to a view of probability theory as a generalization of classical logic (namely via the fact that deducibility can be defined in terms of p [250]). This is particularly important in connection with a point made by Miller in his last section, namely that the relations of "relevance" or "empirical support" favored by later inductivists are not easily seen as generalizing deducibility, based on which he concludes that "inductive logic . . . is not after all an extension of deductive logic" (257).

Also of particular interest is Miller's discussion (257-60) of Popper's (and his own) thesis that the part of the content of a hypothesis H which goes beyond the content of some piece of evidence E is never supported by E. In other words: although it is true that evidence can (in a well-defined sense) provide partial support to a hypothesis which it does not deductively necessitate, this is always due only to the fact that the content of the hypothesis and the content of the evidence partially overlap. The discussion is interesting in part because Miller points out the inadequacy of Popper's early attempts to state and prove the thesis, but then makes a good case that the later, more careful treatment (by Popper and himself) is successful. At the very least, we were left with the impression that the view remains tenable.

Frank Jackson's brief "Popper's Philosophy of Mind" is marked by puzzlement about Popper's position, but this arises more from the current state of the sub-discipline known as philosophy of mind than from anything specific to Popper. Not that Popper's thought in this area is transparent, or transparently sensible. But to make any sense of it, one would have to begin outside the narrow range of positions on ontology, metaphysical dynamics (substance and causality), and epistemology within which the current sub-discipline circulates. For one thing, Jackson, like Musgrave, inappropriately tries to put Popper's talk of World 3 somewhere in the territory contested between Benacerraf's worry about causal connection and Quine's indispensability argument.

A similar problem makes it difficult for Jackson to assess Popper's "dualist interactionism." The background against which this can be understood is not one in which mechanist realists occasionally pump up their "intuitions" about zombies to the point where they imagine a problem to which qualia are the solution. Rather, it is an Austrian, Brentano-influenced "Kantian" scene in which people who are essentially subjective idealists try to explain why we should not simply identify the material world with (a part of) the contents of our consciousness. From this point of view, the proposal that the contents of consciousness are themselves another kind of stuff (Jackson calls it "ectoplasm"), something we need to postulate as somehow appended to the world of bodies, is just not relevant. The question is: what does the postulating? Whether Popper's response to this is particularly interesting or illuminating we are unsure, but it is from that point of view that his thought needs to be approached.

Ian Jarvie's "Popper's Philosophy and the Methodology of Social Science" also begins by bemoaning and puzzling over the lack of uptake of Popper's thought. "The scope and depth of Popper's philosophy of the social sciences is not much appreciated beyond the small circle of specialists in his ideas." (284; see also footnote 1) Jarvie, himself a distinguished contributor to debates in philosophy of the social sciences, maintains that Popper's "intervention in the centuries-old discussion about the nature of human rationality is . . . his most fruitful and original contribution to contemporary thought about how to grow our knowledge of society". (284) However, Jarvie proves oddly blind to tensions in those Popperian views he cites and seemingly endorses. For example, he records without elaboration that "Popper, like Hayek, opposes holism in moral political deliberations: terrible things were done to real people in the name of collectivities." (289) Yet, just a few lines later, Jarvie states that Popper's theory "of objectivity is social: to the degree that it exists, objectivity resides in the institutional framework of science that is designed to check those biases of individuals that infect their scientific results." (289) But how then to prise apart the unwanted holism of the moral and the social nature of objectivity? Jarvie offer no hint of explication here.

He also acknowledges that Popper admits "that scientific values such as truth, relevance, simplicity and so forth are deeply anchored in extra-scientific value judgments, including religious ones" (289; see also 311, footnote 11). The question then of how to distinguish the moral and the scientific, the social and the objective, now appears quite muddied. Yet, Jarvie insists (in keeping with others in this volume), "Popper developed a new theory of rationality: an idea is rational to the extent that it is open to criticism. This was his major breakthrough." (298-9) This statement may well be correct. But Jarvie himself also remarks "Popper adds little to the core notion of instrumental rationality found in Weber" (305). Complications come thick and fast, much faster than clarifications or solutions. And so when Jarvie finally turns to "redeem my claim . . . that one of Popper's most original contributions to philosophy of the social science is his rehabilitation of rationality," (307) he offers no more than the following bromide: "His originality lay in exporting rationality from the mind to the attitudinal, from the computational to the institutional." (308) But this simply returns one to the problem of separating science and the social, one that Jarvie nowhere hints how to solve.

Geoffrey Stokes's "Popper and Habermas: Convergent Arguments for a Postmetaphysical Universalism" explores interesting and important parallels between two thinkers whom one might imagine as providing only a study in contrasts. But the Methodenstreit notwithstanding, both Popper and Habermas have been deeply invested in articulating conceptions of universal rationality and open discussion. (324) This essay resonates in interesting ways with Jarvie's, but Stokes, more than Jarvie, acknowledges "that the method of 'situational logic' played a vital role, though important questions of interpretation and understanding remained underdeveloped." (324) Somewhat ironically, especially in the context of this volume, Stokes in his explication of Popper's position proves an honest broker of Popperian thought. The following quote proves representative of this: "Given all that it is intended to protect, however, Popper's political theory of democracy remains relatively underdeveloped and uncritical." (336) Again, however appealing Popper's claims might seem, the devil remains in the details, and the details, as Stokes acknowledges, remain to be determined.

Jeremy Shearmur's "Popper's Politics and Political Thought" abjures from the outset any explicit consideration of Popper's accounts of Plato and Marx, a strategy to be applauded. However, the essay also repeats biographical details about Popper's personal political odyssey multiply recounted by others (especially Hacohen and Stokes). Quite in tension with several other contributors, however, who date Popper's theory of rationality to work already done in the 1930s, Shearmur asserts that at the point where Popper writes, e.g., The Open Society and Its Enemies his political thought is marked by the "absence of a general theory of rationality." (359) This seems at odds with the very ability to characterize a society as "open" in Popper's sense of the term. Shearmur also follows other essays that acknowledge rather than explore difficulties in Popper's thought. For example, Shearmur observes, "Popper himself thus highlighted things which people might strongly desire but which he thinks cannot be achieved within a free and open society." (366) But he then adds "while Popper recognizes that there may be such issues, it is not clear that he offers us an adequate way of dealing with them." (366) He concludes his essay with a complaint made by others that while Popper's thought "has played a relatively marginal role in the development of the wider field of social political philosophy," it nonetheless "deserves to be treated in much greater depth." (371) However, a case for so treating it will not be found in Shearmur's essay.[1]

[1] The volume contains 13 essays. Abraham Stone has been primary reviewer for essay 3, 4, 5, 8, 9, and 10. The others have been the primary responsibility of Paul A. Roth.