Truth, Objects, Infinity: New Perspectives on the Philosophy of Paul Benacerraf

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Fabrice Pataut (ed.), Truth, Objects, Infinity: New Perspectives on the Philosophy of Paul Benacerraf, Springer, 2016, 309pp., $149.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319459783.

Reviewed by A.C. Paseau, University of Oxford


Paul Benacerraf's influence on recent philosophy of mathematics is unrivalled. His articles 'What Numbers Could Not Be' (WNCNB) and 'Mathematical Truth' remain cornerstones of the subject, while the two editions of 'Benacerraf and Putnam' virtually defined the discipline in the late 20th century. Benacerraf's published output -- fourteen articles, including a pair in this collection, plus the odd review, interview and introduction -- is spare and judicious, qualities reflected in his writing. The latter is also playful, memorably so. Would WNCNB have so fired the collective imagination had its protagonists not been called Jonny and Ernie? Does the title of its last section, 'Way Out', herald a solution, or warn us of its fanciful conclusions? Can you think of a better title for a philosophical article than 'God, the Devil and Gödel'? Could anyone ever forget what a Princess Margaret Premise is?

Benacerraf has been honoured with a collection on his work before: Benacerraf and his Critics, edited by Adam Morton and Stephen P. Stitch and published in 1996. Fabrice Pataut's successor to the Morton and Stitch volume grew out of a workshop held in May 2012. Fittingly, the workshop took place in Paris, where Benacerraf was born in 1931 and spent his early years. (As Mary Leng points out in her chapter, 1931 saw both the publication of Gödel's theorems and the birth of the philosopher who had the greatest hand in shaping the philosophy of mathematics in its post-Incompleteness-Theorems era.) Benacerraf's fondness for his native city remains undiminished and he proudly retains French citizenship, even after eight decades in the US. I must declare a personal connection to -- and affection for -- Paul, whom I know from a postgraduate year spent at Princeton, during which I attended his Philosophy of Mathematics seminar and he generously read much of my philosophical juvenilia.

The present volume is divided into an Introduction followed by four parts. In his retrospective 'What Mathematical Truth Could not be -- I', Benacerraf referred to the philosophical premise that must always be added to a formal argument to yield a philosophical conclusion as the 'Princess Margaret Premise'. No such conclusion follows without, in Benacerraf's own words, 'a significant injection of philosophical serum'. In the Introduction, Pataut goes in search of a Princess Margaret Premise with which to supplement Gödel's First Incompleteness Theorem. He advocates a premise from which it follows that 'there is at least one capacity that the anti-libertarian or hard-nosed computationalist is unable to count for' (p. xxxv).

A piece by Jody Azzouni opens Part I, on Benacerraf's Dilemma. The chapter begins, controversially, by averring that Benacerraf's problem is 'recognizably a modern one, not visible to earlier philosophers concerned with mathematical entities' (p. 4). There follow some brief defensive remarks on the makes no difference argument, to the effect that if mathematical objects ceased to exist, this would make no difference to mathematical practice. The main focus of Azzouni's contribution, however, is Mark McEvoy's argument that Benacerraf's epistemic puzzle has no implications for the existence of mathematical objects in the absence of a further metaphysical premise. The chapter is in essence a short reply to this paper. Azzouni examines what the further metaphysical premise might be. His suggestion: if an object plays no epistemic role, then it is mind- and language-dependent and therefore does not exist.

Brice Halimi's contribution draws an analogy between Kant's antinomy of pure reason and Benacerraf's dilemma in 'Mathematical Truth'. Halimi sets outs the analogy in a table on page 48 and claims that it is 'remarkably steady and sharp' (p. 59). Though to my mind a little strained, the analogy does raise the interesting prospect of solving Benacerraf's dilemma by carrying over Kant's solution to his antinomy. Halimi hints at such a solution, which he calls the presentational account (p. 56). Roughly, the idea is that doing mathematics involves shifting between two perspectives. The first is the semantical perspective, which presupposes that mathematical terms have referents. The second is the combinatorial perspective, which sees proofs and presentations as all there is. The crucial issue is how to reconcile these two perspectives, as Benacerraf has long insisted.

A highlight of the volume is Justin Clarke-Doane's 'What is the Benacerraf Problem?' Clarke-Doane examines the version of the problem developed by Hartry Field, which has come to be known as the reliability challenge. The challenge is to explain how our beliefs about 'remote' abstract objects so accurately reflect the facts about them. Field suggests that it is in principle impossible to give such an explanation. The challenge is a descendant, or an updated version, of the epistemic horn of Benacerraf's argument in 'Mathematical Truth'.

Clarke-Doane's chapter is a sustained attempt to answer the following question: 'In what sense of "explain the reliability" is it plausible both that it appears in principle impossible to explain the reliability of our mathematical beliefs and that the apparent in principle impossibility of explaining their reliability undermines them?' (p. 33; the passage is italicised in the original). As he and others (including the present author) have argued, mathematical beliefs on their standard construal meet a sensitivity condition. Since mathematical truths are necessary, there is no possible world in which the mathematical facts are other than what they actually are. On standard semantics for counterfactuals the following conditional is then true: if it were not the case that 2 + 2 = 4, we would not believe that 2 + 2 = 4. Similarly, such beliefs meet a safety condition. Since we could not easily have had different mathematical beliefs, it follows that in all nearby worlds our mathematical beliefs are true. The reason we could not easily have had different mathematical beliefs, Clarke-Doane argues, is that our core such beliefs (e.g. that 2 + 2 = 4) are evolutionarily inevitable, while more sophisticated mathematical beliefs (such as that integer addition is commutative) abductively follow from core ones, using abductive methods that are themselves safe in the epistemologist's sense.

Clarke-Doane applies the same argument to other areas, notably ethics and modality. A particularly striking consequence is that if there is an evolutionary debunking argument aimed at F-realism, then this is an indication that a realist about the area F can establish the safety of her beliefs (p. 35). The reason, briefly, is that if evolution ensures that we have certain F-beliefs, then we must have them in all nearby worlds, so that there are no nearby worlds in which our F-beliefs are false, assuming that the F-facts are the same in nearby worlds. In sum, if Clarke-Doane is right, a successful epistemological challenge to platonism has significant hurdles to clear.

Andrea Sereni's carefully argued chapter, the last in Part I, comes to a similar conclusion. Sereni advances a dilemma for Field's reliability challenge. He argues that a strong notion of reliability is too controversial to do the work expected of it by anti-platonists. But a weaker notion of reliability cannot impugn platonism; this applies in particular to any causal account of reliability. The upshot is that the platonist has nothing to fear from the reliability challenge.

Marco Panza's long chapter, the penultimate one in Part I, tries to articulate what exactly Benacerraf's challenge (and Field's reformulation) is and what it is not. The chapter's argumentative twists and turns defy easy summary, but perhaps its main point is this. The semantic and epistemic horns of the dilemma may be overcome by providing a careful account of mathematics that explains how mathematicians may achieve de re epistemic access to mathematical objects while working within the constraints of a theory. It is important that this knowledge be de re, to exclude its being about 'reifications of concepts or bundles of properties' (p. 79). It is likewise important that access to these objects be achieved by means of a theory, in order to satisfy the combinatorialist's qualms. Panza uses neo-Fregeanism as a case study to illustrate his ideas.

The first chapter in Part II is by Sébastien Gandon. He points out that in 'Frege: The Last Logicist' Benacerraf descried and decried an important confusion surrounding the notion of analyticity. When positivists such as Hempel asserted that mathematics is logic, they relied on the technical sense advocated by Frege: an analytic truth is a logical truth modulo definitions. But when they reflected on what this implies philosophically, they took such truths to be true in virtue of meaning. According to Benacerraf's interpretation, Frege was only interested in the first sense of analyticity, and was never moved to argue that mathematical knowledge is a species of linguistic knowledge. His interests were more mathematical. But what exactly were these interests, and to what extent can they be separated from philosophical ones? In the second half of his chapter, Gandon essays an answer, in a way that has some affinities with Benacerraf's approach while departing from it in several respects. He stresses that the best way to formulate a proposition is a contentious issue within mathematics. Algebraists, analysts and geometers all have different perspectives, which affect how they would structure the subject. This concern with 'architectonic', Gandon claims, lies at the heart of Frege's mathematical endeavour. Frege strove 'to promote a Gaussian vision of mathematics in which arithmetic (the queen of the sciences) is neatly distinguished from the other mathematical disciplines, especially geometry' (p. 142).

In the next chapter, Mary Leng engagingly discusses how, if at all, Benacerraf's dilemma affects Quine's empiricist philosophy. As she points out, 'Quine's account of the confirmation of empirical theories is designed precisely so as to integrate our knowledge of mathematical truths into our over-all account of knowledge' (p. 153). Science is a convenient way of organising experience, and mathematics, as part of that enterprise, is justified by scientific canons. Leng examines how Quine's holistic picture of confirmation must be adapted to take into account the apparent fact that indispensable science consists of theoretical falsehoods (idealisations, metaphors, and the like) as well as truths. Her conclusion is that the much-maligned criterion of causal efficacy found in 'Mathematical Truth' has an important role to play in distinguishing theoretical posits that play an explanatory role in scientific success from those that do not.

Next up is a short piece by Philippe de Rouilhan on Ernie and Johnny, of WNCNB fame. What statements of set theory, de Rouilhan asks, should Ernie and Johnny take as common ground? Clearly, the set-theoretic formulation of '2 is prime' is one such, whereas '3 ∈ 17' is not. The question lends itself to interesting formal treatment, as de Rouilhan shows. Readers will have to work hard, however, to extract the key formal results from his informal presentation.

Part II ends with a close reading and rational reconstruction of WNCNB's last section, 'Way Out', by Stewart Shapiro, who soberly interprets its title as 'Solution' rather than 'Far Out'. Benacerraf puzzlingly claimed that statements of identity are meaningful only if the terms flanking the identity sign are associated with the same category: examples are '2 = 1 + 1' and '2 = 3', whereas '2 = ' is a foil. Shapiro sketches a possible justification of this idea by deploying Friedrich Waismann's notion of open texture. Nothing in the established use of the identity sign determines that 2 is equal to , he suggests, just as nothing in the established use of the word 'cat' determines whether or not a creature exhibiting a combination of feline and non-feline properties is a cat. (Waismann imagines a creature that looks like a cat but later grows to a gigantic size or can be revived from death.) The ontological question of whether numbers are sets is similarly indeterminate, Shapiro claims. It may be resolved one way or the other, should we wish to do so (we may not).

Part III consists of two chapters on supertasks, the topic of Benacerraf's 1962 article 'Tasks, Supertasks and the Modern Eleatics', his first publication. The first chapter, by Jon Pérez Laraudogoitia, concerns Benardete's 'paradox of the gods'. A man decides to walk one mile, from A to B. God 1 stands ready to block the man's further advance beyond a point half a mile from A, God 2 to do the same when the man is a quarter of a mile from A, and so on ad infinitum. The infinitely many deities' intentions prevent the man from ever setting off. Pérez Laraudogoitia considers variations and generalisations of this original example. One generalisation, for example, involves a man following a specified world line rather than remaining stationary at a point. Pérez Laraudogoitia is particularly interested in which versions of the Benardete 'paradox' are compatible with Newtonian physical theory and which are not.

The second chapter in Part III is by Antonio León-Sanchez and Ana C. León-Mejía. They claim that J.F Thomson's 'Tasks and super-tasks' and Benaceraf's 'Tasks, Supertasks and Modern Eleatics' jointly 'laid the foundations for a new infinitist theory, independent of set theory' (p. 224, see also p. 233). The authors attempt to substantiate that claim by analysing arguments such as those of Thomson's lamp (which is switched on and off ω-many times in a finite time interval) or Cantor's argument that the set of algebraic and rational numbers are both denumerable. The gist of one of their central arguments is that a particle travelling at finite velocity backwards through an ω -sequence, that is from an ωth point to 0, will cross infinitely many points 'instantaneously', though the points are separated by finite distances (see pp. 230-1).

The retrospective Part IV consists of two chapters by Benacerraf. The first is a 1968 draft of 'Mathematical Truth', whose descendant was published five years later. This chattier and less streamlined draft is as replete with insights as the later version. In the first paragraph Benacerraf apologises for saying nothing new, though how seriously he means it is unclear, as the rest of the sentence ends with a joke about Putnam. (An interesting historical question, not broached in this volume, is just how original the dilemma posed in 'Mathematical Truth' is.) One of the more important differences between the 1968 and 1973 versions is Benacerraf's insistence in the earlier one that those who give a non-realist account of set theory must provide a new account of logical consequence (see pp. 265, 277).

The volume concludes with a graduate lecture Benacerraf delivered around 1975. This lecture is dense with ideas and arguments. One argument is a strengthening of that given in WNCNB. Benacerraf remarks that Frege's definition of numbers built in the very notion of cardinality, thereby giving his set-theoretic reduction 'first priority on correctness' (p. 290), or so one might argue. He points out, however, that one can similarly build in the notion of cardinality starting from Zermelo's progression, or von Neumann's, or any other. Some typographical errors in this passage, which hinder smooth comprehension of the formal material, are noted in the last paragraph below.

As is apparent from WNCNB and 'What Mathematical Truth Could Not be -- I', Benacerraf worried about how his argument in the former affects what in his 1975 lecture he calls the early Quinean position. According to this view, the claim that numbers are sets should not be taken as a revelation about the true nature of numbers. Reduction instead is 'seen as casting about for what would do the work of the numbers' (p. 296). Benacerraf adduces some further thoughts on Quine's position, pointing out in passing that Quine's criterion of ontological commitment is strongly biased in favour of reduction (it 'stands as our ontic super-ego'). He also presents a snappy argument which, if sound, solves the Julius Caesar Problem. Here's the argument: 'Babylonian mathematicians did not know about Caesar; but they knew that 3 > 2; hence Caesar is not 3'. This argument, Benacerraf suggests, does not rely on fallacious substitution in an opaque context, as it might appear.

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