Trials of Reason: Plato and the Crafting of Philosophy

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David Wolfsdorf, Trials of Reason: Plato and the Crafting of Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2008, 285pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195327328.

Reviewed by Will Rasmussen, King's College London


Trials of Reason is the fruition of a decade of research and publication that Wolfsdorf draws upon to demonstrate how the fourteen 'early' or 'Socratic' dialogues that he examines are unified by a common purpose. The dialogues are the Apology, Charmides, Crito, Euthydemus, Euthyphro, Gorgias, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Ion, Laches, Lysis, Meno, Protagoras, and Republic I. The common purpose is Plato's 'legitimizing' portrayal of the motivation, practice and goal of philosophy in opposition to the enervating and pernicious influence of 'antiphilosophy', viz. the thoughtless and sometimes self-serving acceptance of conventional views (15). Two virtues of this book continually strike the reader. The first is Wolfsdorf 's frequent references to the texts as he builds his case. The second is his discussion of and argument over so wide a range of issues that have attracted scholarly interest and debate in regard to these dialogues.

Wolfsdorf aims 'to reach a relatively broad audience', and he is likely to succeed for three reasons (261). The first is the clarity of his writing that renders his arguments readily transparent. Then, as he points out in the note to his bibliography, he refers readers who are not familiar with the vast amount of relevant secondary literature, and wish to be so, to his previous articles. This leaves the book free from detailed engagement with the secondary literature that would otherwise burden the book. The third reason is the considerable care with which Wolfsdorf lays the groundwork for his presentation and treatment of the problems he addresses. This care is apparent not just in his introductory chapter, but throughout the main text and in footnotes where Wolfsdorf gives an account of philosophical terms that the non-specialist reader may not know, e.g. the de re/de dicto distinction (34, n. 20), the different forms of reductio arguments (40, n. 41 & 53), and the distinction between 'Socratic', 'Platonic', and 'Plato's' doctrines (21-3).

In his first chapter Wolfsdorf offers an excellent survey up to the present day of strategies for interpreting Plato (although I presume 'Middle Academy' on p. 5 is meant to read 'New Academy'). It is especially welcome to note Wolfsdorf's reliance on the exceptional scholarship of E. N. Tigerstedt (6, n. 6). Wolfsdorf also recounts the achievements of recent scholars in revealing the hermeneutic significance of Plato's use of his chosen genre of dialogue for philosophical writing. In particular, he elucidates the importance of the impact that the political culture, the characters and their behaviour in the dramatic frame exert on the philosophical content of the dialogues in which the arguments are embedded.

Wolfsdorf emphasizes that his goal is to 'seek Platonic views' and he defines a Platonic view as 'a view that Plato intended to advance as compelling within the discursive framework of the dialogue in contrast to a related conventional view' (21). The strategy for achieving this goal consists in the exposition in these fourteen dialogues of what Wolfsdorf calls 'α-structure':

a dramatic or discursive structure constituted by a linear sequence or progression of beliefs and values, at one pole of which lie conventional and traditional (antiphilosophical) views and values and at the other pole of which lie Platonic (philosophical) views and values. (15)

Wolfsdorf devotes the rest of his book to arguing that in each dialogue there is a 'doxastic base … a common cognitive point of departure, conventional or traditional belief' from which 'Platonic arguments' proceed in order 'to lead the intended audience from a conventional conception of the topic treated in the text to a Platonic conception of that topic' (22 & 251). The subsequent four chapters then track this philosophical journey in the fourteen dialogues, often responding to the numerous claims and counterclaims of Platonic scholars, to what Wolfsdorf concludes are Platonic views on desire and the good, on avowals of knowledge, on heuristic method and the 'Socratic fallacy', and on Plato's philosophical uses for Socrates' aporia.

In Chapter Two Wolfsdorf argues that we find in these dialogues a Platonic 'subjectivist conception' of desire, stipulating desire to be the result of the subject's evaluation of the object of desire as good, and which denies the possibility of akrasia or weakness of will (38, 49 & 59). We do not necessarily desire the good de re, but we do de dicto, and we never desire the bad de dicto, although we may do so de re. His examination of these dialogues produces a compelling case for this, but one is left with a worry that Wolfsdorf wants to go too far in narrowing the conception of desire in Platonic theory to preclude desire that exists prior to or outside of the activity of normative judgment. It is quite true, as he points out, that in these dialogues Plato's interest is to have Socrates address desire as it appears in and engages with our deliberative cognitions that direct our purposive activity. If, as Wolfsdorf says, the Platonic view is that desire for something follows 'its fallible evaluation as good', then this will deny that animals or infants experience desire (72). Wolfsdorf seems to acknowledge this difficulty; at least he makes provision in Platonic theory for 'preevaluative' and 'prerational' desire by deriving another Platonic conception of desire from his analysis of the Lysis and the notion of what 'naturally belongs' to us. Desire is also for what 'naturally belongs' to the subject, but 'in which the subject is deficient', e.g. a deficiency of food gives rise to the pre-evaluative desire for food, which gives rises to a fallible evaluation of something as good food, which culminates in desire for that evaluated object (72-3). The worry is that we end up with two Platonic conceptions of desire that denote two distinct classes whose common characteristic qua desire is left undetermined. It would not threaten both of Wolfsdorf 's claims were he to view these purportedly different classes of desire as different roles for desire that Plato in different dialogues selects for examination: desire's post-evaluative role as propellant of deliberated purposive activity and desire's pre-evaluative role as prompter of deliberation towards the satisfaction of wants. This would allow desire the sort of scope that Wolfsdorf observes Plato giving to philia, as not just 'friendship', but also more widely 'the relationship of bonding' (59).

At the end of Chapter Two Wolfsdorf argues for another Platonic view: philosophia is the form of desire that alone enables us to 'achieve psychological fulfilment', contrary to the conventional view that the 'antiphilosophical' loves of honour (philotimia) and of pleasure (philhêdonia) secure this, for only knowledge of what is truly good can guarantee that our desires are for what is truly beneficial (74-6 & 85). So, in Chapter Three Wolfsdorf argues for Platonic views on knowledge: that excellence (aretê) is knowledge of the good and that this excellence is an epistemic unity (100), that non-ethical knowledge (the technai) is neither good nor bad, but ethical knowledge (the knowledge of the good) is responsible for well-being (eudaimonia) (110), that definitional knowledge of something necessarily precedes knowing anything about it (123 & 131), and that consistent with this Socrates never avows ethical knowledge, for his few epistemic claims are to be construed as serving 'the pedagogical-dramaturgical objectives to which α-structure is put' (144). That is to say, where Socrates avows knowledge, it regularly supports the doxastic base, or point of departure, from which the interlocutors are led to an unconventional Platonic view. Clearly, Wolfsdorf covers much controversial ground here, but he stays close to the texts and defends his corner convincingly.

Chapter Four wrestles with the Hydra of 'Socratic method'. Having identified the epistemological priority of definitional knowledge as a Platonic view and the principal business of these dialogues, Wolfsdorf assesses how this is carried out. He crosses swords with Vlastos, rejecting 'the problem of the elenchus' and the characterization of Socratic examination as incapable of positive conclusions (154-5). He admits that the positive conclusions we find are conditional upon certain mutually agreed premises, but introduces the notion of 'cognitive security' as the 'epistemic' justification for these premises, which do not warrant epistemic certainty or 'knowledge' qua technê (179-81). Wolfsdorf argues that Socrates did not have a distinctive method, the elenchus, which was supplanted in the Meno by a new method of argument ex hupotheseôs. His detailed analysis of the Meno demonstrates the difference between Socrates' use of the hypothesis and its use in mathematics, so that Socrates' arguments from hypothesis can be seen as consistent with his elenctic procedure of reducing the complex conventional views of his interlocutors to absurdity or contradiction (160 & 177). The chapter ends with an investigation of the F-conditions or the requirements that an answer to a 'What is F?' question must satisfy to count as definitional knowledge. After combing through the texts citing the various F-conditions that Socrates formulates as objections to the inadequate proposals of his respondents, Wolfsdorf concludes that the force of Peter Geach's 'Socratic fallacy' still prevails. He finds that the F-conditions are not 'cognitively secure' enough to underwrite definitional knowledge, and yet without a definition of F we have no access to the truth value of 'nondefinitional propositions' about F, which might have offered us material for the derivation of a definitional knowledge of F: 'it remains doubtful that these texts offer a cogent method by which definitional knowledge can be pursued' (196).

In the light of this epistemological problem, Wolfsdorf turns in his last chapter to consider why Plato chose to end many of his dialogues in aporia. He rejects the thesis that the dramatic aporiai in which these works often end reflect Plato's 'honest perplexity', and instead construes them as reflecting 'the enterprise of philosophy as a trial' and the 'ordeals of philosophy' in its conflict with antiphilosophy (207-8). Most of the chapter consists in a close examination of the Charmides as a dramatization of 'the vulnerability of philosophy to antiphilosophical social and psychological forces', as Critias' love of esteem (philotimia) 'consistently contrasts' with Socrates' philosophia (210 & 218). As for the failure of the investigation into self-knowledge in the second half of the dialogue, Wolfsdorf blames Socrates for being 'too docile and concessive' and allowing Critias 'to mislead the investigation' (233). There is a great deal of biographical and literary interest in Wolfsdorf 's account of aporia in the Charmides, and while there is much merit in Wolfsdorf 's motivational account of the dramatic aporia, he offers little by way of account for the 'epistemological aporia'. To account for the failure of the arguments about self-knowledge, he suggests the cause may have been difficulties in the conceptualization of the Platonic view that 'goodness is order and Form' (234).

However, given that the lion's share of this chapter consists in an exegesis of the second half of the Charmides, it is regrettable that Wolfsdorf does not here, as he does elsewhere, make use of Tigerstedt's 'double dialogue reading', more widely known in recent years as the 'maieutic reading'. For this hermeneutic strategy is able to demonstrate how the 'epistemological aporia' at the level of the fictional interlocutors motivates philosophical progress at the level of the non-fictional 'interlocutors', viz. the provocative author (Plato) and his reflective readers (us). In the case of the Charmides, the manner in which the arguments of Critias and Socrates fail to make sense of self-knowledge as either possible or worthwhile places this dialogue centrally in Plato's epistemological project of probing with the reader (through both 'early' and 'later' dialogues) for an adequate understanding of what knowledge is, such that, among other things, knowledge can accommodate the self-knowledge that Socrates exhibits throughout these dialogues.[1]

Wolfsdorf 's book ends with a splendid appendix on the notorious problem of Socratic irony, examining primary and secondary sources, and offering a compelling argument for the denial that we are ever justified in explaining inconsistencies in Socratic utterances by attributing verbal irony to Socrates. Explicating the distinction between verbal irony and dramatic, situational irony, Wolfsdorf shows how the intended audience of the irony that does appear in the dialogues is not Socrates' interlocutors, but Plato's 'flesh-and-blood' readers, and here Wolfsdorf 's perspicuity and careful exegetical work demonstrate the power of the double dialogue or maieutic reading of the dialogues to resolve recalcitrant problems of interpretation (256).

In Trials of Reason there is much excellent material worthy of mention that space here does not permit. The balance Wolfsdorf strikes in his writing between elementary explanation and detailed cognizance of the scholarly literature will indeed ensure that his book reaches a 'broad audience' and that his readers will come away having addressed, with close reading of the texts, the full spectrum of debate that has focussed upon these fourteen dialogues.

[1] For a demonstration of this see Rasmussen, W. (2006) 'Resolving Inconsistencies in Plato: the Problem of Socratic Wisdom in the Apology and the Charmides', pp. 171 ff. London Philosophy PhD Theses,