Triangulation: From an Epistemological Point of View

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Maria Cristina Amoretti and Gerhard Preyer (eds.), Triangulation: From an Epistemological Point of View, Ontos, 2011, 286pp., €89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381191.

Reviewed by Nathaniel Goldberg, Washington and Lee University


This is a collection of eleven essays, plus introduction, on Donald Davidson on triangulation. The contributors variously take triangulation to be an activity, analogy, argument, or figure, by or according to which two creatures interact with one another given their shared environment.[1] In what follows I begin with comments on the essays generally. The bulk of this review concerns the essays individually. I close with a brief recommendation for readership.

Generally the essays are uneven in quality, content, and length. Some are insightful, others confused. Some are merely critical, others also constructive. Some are long, others jarringly short. Moreover, triangulation is relevant to epistemology, metaphysics, philosophy of language, and philosophy of mind, all of which get discussed, as well as philosophy of literature, which does not. Hence the reason behind the collection's subtitle is murky. Relatedly, the collection is divided into three parts: "The Epistemological Turn," "Communication and Environment," and "Philosophical Geography." Yet these titles have no discernible bearing on their content.

Let us turn to the essays individually. The editors' introduction, "Mind, Knowledge, and Communication in Triangular Externalism," identifies two purposes of triangulation: (a) to explain how thought and language get empirical content, and (b) to explain the genetic origin of the concept of objectivity. Regarding (a), Amoretti and Preyer's line on Davidson is that in basic cases mental and linguistic content are the objects and events that one triangulates with fellow language users when acquiring concepts and terms for them. Regarding (b), the possibility of a co-triangulator's perspective contrasting with one's own is a condition on the possibility of acquiring the concept of error and with it objectivity. These are roughly Davidson's views. Nonetheless the introduction's infelicities and typographical errors distract from them.

The first four essays constitute Part I. Claudine Verheggen's "Triangulation and Philosophical Skepticism," scrutinizes Barry Stroud on Davidson's use of triangulation against skepticism. Stroud makes three claims. First, triangulation shows at most that belief attribution is largely truth ascribing. It says nothing about belief possession. Second, for Davidson, since belief is essentially veridical, it is unintelligible to argue that beliefs are not generally false. And third, since we cannot step outside our beliefs to assess them, we are unjustified in believing the anti-skeptical conclusion.

Two points are noteworthy. First, though Stroud is influential, some explanation for why Verheggen focuses exclusively on him would be helpful. Second, neither Verheggen nor the editors explain how this anti-skeptical use of triangulation connects to (a) and (b), above. Regardless, Verheggen does answer Stroud's claims well. Regarding the first, she explains that triangulation functions in radical interpretation, involving belief attribution, but also in language and thought acquisition, involving belief possession. Regarding the second, Verheggen responds that even if we cannot argue that beliefs are not generally false, we can still assert that many are true. Regarding the third, Verheggen appeals to Davidson's own response that Stroud is "demanding more of knowledge than is justified."[2]

Amoretti's "Triangulation between Externalism and Internalism," discusses the connection between Davidson's content externalism (discussed already) and epistemic internalism (according to which justification for belief is in some sense internal to the believer). To answer the skeptic Davidson must establish that beliefs are justified and true. Yet given his epistemic internalism he cannot appeal to anything external to establish justification. So Davidson appeals to something "internal," an a priori argument, which Amoretti reconstructs. She then considers two skeptical scenarios against which Davidson's argument seems to fail. Nonetheless, she concludes that by rejecting strong epistemic internalism and lowering our epistemic standards, Davidson can answer the skeptic.

This is an interesting essay. Nevertheless, after reminding us that for Davidson some beliefs get their content not directly from the environment but inferentially from other beliefs, Amoretti lets this distinction drop. (Most commentators never raise it.) I would have liked discussion of how inferential beliefs impact skepticism.

Kirk Ludwig's "Triangulation Triangulated," re-identifies the two uses of triangulation. The first, roughly (b), is as "an analogy to help explain the central idea of a transcendental argument designed to show that we can have the concept of objective truth only in the context of communication with another speaker" (p. 69). Ludwig however finds the argument a failure. On the one hand, since to possess a concept is to possess a disposition to employ it, Davidson fails to show why we can have the concept of objective truth only in the context of actual communication. On the other hand, even if we could have it, this would at most ground the concept of objective truth according to the subject, not simpliciter.

All this is well argued. Moreover I am sympathetic with Ludwig's initial move concerning interpreting a concept. Nonetheless, it is insufficient to be merely disposed to employ a concept to haveacquired it. Acquisition requires actual communication. So I think that Ludwig's initial move fails. Conversely, Ludwig's move of distinguishing subjective from objective concepts of objective truth seems to ignore Davidson's point that the possibility of surprise presupposes the concept of objective truth simpliciter. And, according to Davidson, triangulators can be surprised.

The second use of triangulation that Ludwig identifies, roughly (a), is as "a solution to the problem of underdetermination of thought and meaning by the patterns of causal relations we stand in to the environment" (p. 69). Without triangulation content would be too underdetermined -- too many causal lines connect subject with environment -- to be worthy of the name. Ludwig then considers whether this "underdetermination" is merely an instance of Davidson's acknowledged interpretive indeterminacy. Though I cannot discuss it here, the ensuing analysis is among the most insightful in the book.

Adina L. Roskies' "Triangulation and Objectivity: Squaring the Circle?" describes scenarios in which boxes with lights, in increasing order of responsiveness to one another, simulate triangulation. Yet these boxes do not possess language. Roskies draws two conclusions. First, triangulation requires joint interaction, not language. Second, triangulators must already have the concept of objectivity lest they treat triangular responses as responses to their own subjective states.

Unfortunately neither conclusion seems fair. Regarding the first, Davidson never claims that triangulation requires language. He himself offers examples of non-linguistic animals and pre-linguistic human children triangulating. Regarding the second, Roskies, like Ludwig, ignores Davidson's point that if a triangulator can be surprised -- and Davidson thinks that she can -- then she possesses the concept of objective truth.

The next three essays constitute Part II. Fredrik Stjernberg's "Knowing Me, Knowing You: Triangulation and Its Discontents," contends that Davidson's handling of differences between us and lower animals is "too crude" (p. 113). I am sure that he is correct. Stjernberg then contends that linguistic ability derives from animals forming groups and seeing differences between them, which presupposes a concept of objectivity; Davidson gets it backward. Nonetheless, I am unsure whether this is inconsistent with Davidson's view. Davidson thinks that it is the primitive group-forming that gives rise to the concept of objectivity. Linguistic ability for him follows that.

Dorit Bar-On and Matthew Priselac's "Triangulation and the Beasts," reminds us that for Davidson, though animals can engage in primitive triangulation, only linguistic creatures can have thought with particular content. But then, Bar-On and Priselac claim, "continuity skepticism" follows: non-linguistic animals have no mental content while linguistic animals do. Bar-On and Priselac attempt to bridge the gap by appealing to expressive behaviors like yelps, growls, and teeth-barings that, they claim, are communicative signals showing rather than telling their expressed states. This is one of the more original essays in the collection. While it remains unclear whether the authors bridge rather than merely move the gap, their ideas are worth a close look.

Sanford C. Goldberg's "Interpreting Assertions," explores the role that assertions can and should play in radical interpretation. According to Goldberg, assertions are governed by the prescription that their utterer believe them to be true, justified, knowledge, or something similar. Consequently, the radical interpreter is obliged to recognize asserters as epistemic agents. Now Goldberg himself doubts that this would be "news" (p. 173) to Davidson, and I agree. Nonetheless, by explicating the role that assertion can and should play, Goldberg fills in and makes more credible Davidson's methodology.

The final four essays constitute Part III. Mario De Caro's "The Short Happy life of the Swampman: Interpretation and Social Externalism in Davidson," concerns Davidson's varying content externalisms and their competition for an analysis of Swampman -- a thought-theoretical entity who is Davidson's behavioral doppelganger, but who unlike Davidson has no causal history with its environment. Davidson's stated conclusion is that while his own utterances have meaning, Swampman's have none.

Canvassing various content externalisms, De Caro correctly deduces that Davidson's is deep, since it permeates all content; physical, since it connects content to objects and events in the physical environment; but not social like Putnam's and Burge's, since the content of one person's thoughts and words is not inherited from anyone else's. It is instead "interpretive social" (p. 181), since content is what it is in virtue of what it is interpreted by another to be. De Caro argues that this interpretive socialism comes late in Davidson's thought, though I am skeptical. Regardless, I agree about the final feature of Davidson's externalism: while initially synchronic, concerned with the state of the environment at the time of the content's instantiation in thought or language, Davidson eventually advocates a diachronic externalism, concerned with the environment over time.

Unfortunately the rest of the essay is not particularly persuasive. On the one hand, to explicate Swampman De Caro turns to Davidson's Omniscient Interpreter -- a thought-theoretical entity omniscient about evidence sufficient for radical interpretation. Yet the Omniscient Interpreter's method is synchronic, while according to Davidson the relevant method for Swampman is diachronic. Perhaps De Caro mistakenly thinks that the Omniscient Interpreter is omniscient about the past.On the other hand, De Caro closes with two reasons to see Swampman as possessing language. First, the radical interpreter would take Swampman to do so. So if Swampman does not possess language, then Swampman possesses something that seems like language which -- because it is not language -- fails to translate into our language. And Davidson prohibits the failure of translatability. Nonetheless, Davidson's prohibition is against the failure of a language to translate into another. Yet this is something that according to De Caro Swampman lacks. Second, according to De Caro, not taking Swampman to possess language violates the principle of charity. Nevertheless this is to say that Swampman possesses language because its utterances are radically interpretable. And that is to say that Davidson should reject diachronic for synchronic content externalism, which rather than defending it is the very issue at hand.

Preyer's "The Externalism of Triangulation," is also problematic. Preyer begins:

The theory that language and meaning follow from radical interpretation (RI) is a continuation of Quine's post-empirical theory of meaning, which claims to identify a cyclical relationship between belief and meaning into which an [sic] radical interpreter must break (p. 197).

Since radical interpretation involves an interpreter's constructing a truth theory for a speaker's language by matching speaker utterances with holistic, charitable truth conditions as articulated in the interpreter's language, language and meaning are prior to radical interpretation. So the first part of Preyer's sentence is false. Since Quine thought that he was offering an empirical -- not a "post-empirical" -- theory according to which there is no meaning, the second part is dubious. And the third part of the sentence requires expansion. This lack of precision infects the entire essay.

Nor could I understand Preyer's reason (p. 261?) for his thesis that RI and triangulation are impossible. My best guess is that Preyer thinks that because radical interpretation is third-personal, it is insufficient to understand the speaker qua agent. I suggest that Preyer read essays 8 and 10 on how Davidson does or could adopt an agential perspective. Likewise, I suggest that Preyer consider that triangulation, and insofar as it appeals to it RI, is second- not third-personal.

Ingvald Fergestad and Bjørn Ramberg's "Triangulation in Action: A Rationalizing Proposal," like Goldberg's essay, pushes Davidson to recognize speakers as agents. Fergestad and Ramberg do so by discussing "Radical Davidson," whose hints are in Davidson's own text but who results from triangulating (in a looser sense) Quine's empiricist naturalist with Robert Brandom's rationalist pragmatist. Brandom's project is to understand content in terms of deontic statuses -- commitments and entitlements to inferences -- that language users bear and of which they keep score. Fergestad and Ramberg have Radical Davidson see triangulation as an activity (and so performed by agents) of attitude-bearing and scorekeeping. What results is a kind of "inferentially articulated triangulation" (p. 237). Moreover, because Brandom focuses on deontic statuses to the exclusion of the objects and events that a Davidsonian triangulator would triangulate, Radical Davidson can improve upon Davidson and Brandom both. Though largely programmatic, this was one of my favorite essays in the collection.

Finally, Jeff Malpas' "Triangulation and Philosophy: A Davidsonian Landscape," urges that though Davidson's work on triangulation has not enraptured many analytic philosophers, it has affinities with other traditions. He discusses Gadamer on interpretation and Heidegger on agential engagement with the environment, and Davidson's own citations of G. H. Mead on the sociology of language. Ramberg also observes that Mead's teacher was Josiah Royce, a deep admirer of Kant, who taught us about transcendental arguments, and Hegel, who emphasized the irreducibility of the second person -- themes running through all these thinkers including Davidson himself. On all this Ramberg is right.

So would I recommend the book? Because of its mixed quality, opaque organizing principle, and narrow focus, I would not recommend it to anyone not a Davidson scholar. Though some new ground is broken, because it is done piecemeal and often inadequately developed, I would not recommend it even to such scholars beyond certain select essays suggested above.[3]

[1] For my part Davidson is best understood as using triangulation to model three situations from which he draws conclusions. First, triangulation models the primitive situation, whose triangulators do not possess language, from which Davidson concludes both that triangulators respond to distal objects and events and that triangulation provides necessary conditions for acquiring the concept of objective truth. Second, triangulation models the learning situation, whose triangulators are teacher and learner, from which Davidson concludes that psychological and semantic content is external. And third, triangulation models the interpretive situation, whose triangulators are radical interpreter and interpretee, from which Davidson concludes that scheme/content dualism is unintelligible and skepticism false ("Triangulation, Untranslatability, and Reconciliation," Philosophia 37 [2009]: 261-80).

[2] "Reply to Barry Stroud," The Philosophy of Donald Davidson, ed. Lewis Edwin Hahn, The Library of Living Philosophers, vol. 27 (La Salle, IL: Open Court), pp. 162-5 at p. 162.

[3] Thanks to Mark LeBar and Matthew Burstein for comments on a draft.