Trouble with Strangers: A Study of Ethics

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Terry Eagleton, Trouble with Strangers: A Study of Ethics, Wiley-Blackwell, 2008, 347pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405185721.

Reviewed by Gopal Balakrishnan, University of California, Santa Cruz


Trouble with Strangers is the latest reflection on ethics from the distinguished literary critic Terry Eagleton. Best known for his witty and sympathetic popularizations of critical theory, Eagleton once claimed that its main contemporary currents -- Marxism, deconstruction, and psychoanalysis -- were devoid of practical ethical corollaries, thereby contributing to a wider condition of relativistic malaise. Eagleton was probably the only proponent of post-structuralism at the time to be troubled by this. But even if it were true that the main variants of post-structuralism once exhibited such nihilist tendencies, one could say that they have all subsequently sought to make amends, for after their 80's heyday, all of them made a turn towards ethical inquiry, along lines laid out by Levinas, Derrida and the late Foucault. Indeed, even Lacanians like Žižek who dismiss the post-structuralist ethics of difference and undecidability, invariably do so in ethical terms. It might also be noted that this development seems to conform to a broader trend that has brought us bio-ethics, professional ethics, and ethical consumerism. Eagleton has addressed this broader ideological context in other works, but in Trouble with Strangers, he limits himself to providing a comparative overview of some of the different conceptions of ethics coming out of that mixture of continental intellectual traditions that is still called 'Theory'.

The plan of the book might initially seem whimsical: the author divides ethical philosophies into categories drawn from Lacan's schema of psychic relations -- the Imaginary, Symbolic and Real -- here offered as little more than a loose framework of classification. Indeed the book's architrave is not even specifically Lacanian, and replicates the terms of Kierkegaard's familiar account of three existential worldviews -- the aesthetic, ethical, and religious. While lumping different bodies of thought together in this way might fail to capture the problems they raise on their own terms, Eagleton often employs this heuristic device to good effect, bringing to light shared assumptions, rhetorics, and blind spots.

The book begins with a consideration of reflections on the psychology of moral sentiments from a number of writers associated with the 18th century Scottish Enlightenment. For Adam Smith, moral sentiment was a form of empathy that took shape in a society based on commercial and status competition, whose members regularly had to confront the possibility of either placing themselves in the shoes of others, disavowing such identification or tuning out the suffering of those too unlike themselves. Eagleton suggests that an ethics based on the limits of our imaginary empathetic identification with other beings can be understood by analogy to what Lacan called the 'imaginary', or the mirror stage of the pre-linguistic infant who knows no sharp boundary between itself and the world. In both instances, imaginary openness can be seen as a kind of infantile closure within which even the loftiest moral feeling comes to rest on fortuitous resemblances and associations between an individual and his fellow creatures. Moral experience in this register is essentially aesthetic. Of course, some moral philosophers of the 18th century did possess a new term -- 'the sublime' -- to designate a form of experience that transcended the sphere of this ordinary moral-aesthetic experience and judgment. But the sublime, in this view, far from being an opening to a dimension of freedom beyond the senses, merely reveals a tendency of the imagination to find meaning in those experiences that momentarily overwhelm it. Put this way, it becomes difficult to distinguish between imaginary and presumably more authentic experiences of the overcoming of this egoistic enclosure.

The second section groups together figures whose understanding of ethics is grounded in a vision of an arduous self-determination directed against the spontaneous tendencies of appetite and imagination. Ethics in this essentially Kantian mold is a rigorous practice of determining our moral commitments through universalizing precepts against the grain of our crooked nature. Eagleton aligns this understanding of ethics with Lacan's symbolic order, in that both presuppose a subject whose autonomy depends on its capacity to stand outside and in permanent opposition to its inclinations and determinations. Both Kant and Lacan seem committed to an impossible autonomy, and thus a tragic conception of the subject. Although moral rigorism of this kind has the appeal of attempting to construct an impartial vantage point from which all human beings can be accorded equal worth -- regardless of whether they are intimates or strangers -- Eagleton ultimately judges it to be too far removed from the capacities of ordinary people to provide a very useful approach to determining the structure of our socially relevant commitments to others.

The last group considered in this book embraces two figures who are often thought to uphold diametrically opposed conceptions of ethics, and so their proponents may not be happy to see them lumped together here. But Eagleton claims that both Emmanuel Levinas on the one hand, and Alain Badiou on the other, subscribe to versions of what Lacan called an 'ethics of the real'. It is only in this third part that the Lacanian terminology becomes significant for the argument, and it is against the authors considered in this part that Eagleton ultimately directs his argument. The 'real' for Lacan does not designate some pre-subjective, pre-social ultimate level of reality, but something like the contradictions in the symbolic order that appear in the form of unintelligible excesses and self-destructive drives. The Antigonean flavor of what Lacan meant by an ethics of the real is captured in the following passage.

All of Sophocles' mighty protagonists … have strayed beyond the protective shell of the symbolic order into some trackless territory of the spirit, thrust by some implacable demand or preternatural purity of being outside the stockade of civil decency to take a place of extreme solitude and self-exposure in which they are set apart in the manner of the sacred. (TwS)

This image of wandering out of the confines of camp captures the unusual form of autonomy that comes from sticking with a desire and being transported by it beyond what is meaningful and socially legible. The ethics of the real might be thought of then as a recalcitrant fixation on a seemingly irrational demand that changes the socio-symbolic coordinates within which that action can be judged. The opposition of good and bad is thereby replaced by another opposition of authentic and inauthentic. According to Eagleton, the problem with this understanding of ethics is that it leads to a spiritual vanguardism that he sees as common to both Levinas and Badiou. The former upholds an impossible commitment to the Other, whose enigmatic face implores us to assume responsibility for his existence as an irreducibly unique, because mortal, being. Levinasian ethics seems to commit us to an infinite responsibility and guilt before the suffering of others, provided that their imploring faces speak to us. By contrast, Badiou is both a Leninist and Nietzschean in his complete rejection of this ethics of finitude and suffering, the unheroic morality of western sentimentalists and shoppers. In frontal opposition to this Levinasian ethics of the minimization of suffering, he affirms a superhuman ethics of living like an immortal, indifferent to death, for it is the absolutization, that is, the fear of death, that keeps us in thrall, he claims. What unites these seemingly counterposed ethics? For Eagleton, both Levinas and Badiou are aestheticists of extreme situations, and the real or Absolute to which their respective ethics are purportedly oriented is not so different from the imaginary experience of the sublime. Neither are very interested in the ordinary problems of everyday social life that would be at the center of the more Aristotelian kind of ethical theory that Eagleton would endorse. Such an ethics, he argues, would have the advantage of bridging the gap between the everyday and the civic-political, and this gap is the crux of our contemporary ethical impasse. Eagleton ends Trouble with Strangers with the argument that such an ethics would necessarily be reformist, but perhaps he would be open to the idea that today even revolutionaries should become Aristotelians.