True Enough

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Catherine Z. Elgin, True Enough, MIT Press, 2017, 337pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262036535.

Reviewed by Henk W. de Regt, Vrije Universiteit Amsterdam


This new book by Catherine Elgin demonstrates her versatility as a philosopher and reflects the broad spectrum of her philosophical interests and expertise. First and foremost, it presents an original, fruitful blend of epistemology and philosophy of science. But it also contains excursions into aesthetics, ethics and the philosophy of history. Elgin weaves these strands together in a way that both impresses and enlightens the reader. One of the book's central topics is the nature of understanding, and here Elgin has played a major role in bridging the divide between epistemology and philosophy of science. Her 1996 book Considered Judgment already demonstrated that she likes to cross boundaries between philosophical disciplines, developing ideas that transcend specialist discourse. In her new book she continues this approach, and presents analyses that should appeal to philosophers with a wide variety of backgrounds.

The running thread is the idea that truth isn't the hallmark or the ultimate aim of science, nor of most other epistemic enterprises. What we strive for in our epistemic practices isn't truth per se but rather understanding -- and absolute truth is not a prerequisite for understanding. But, Elgin adds, this doesn't imply that truth is irrelevant: as the book's title indicates, the contentions we accept have to be 'true enough'. While the focus is on science (and scientific understanding), Elgin applies her analysis to various other disciplinary practices, including history, art and literature, aesthetics and ethics. Thus, she advances the thought-provoking thesis that artworks and literary fiction -- which obviously do not aspire to be true -- can provide us with understanding (and thereby have an epistemic dimension). Elgin develops her view on truth in opposition to 'veritism', the thesis that truth is necessary for epistemic acceptability. By contrast, she submits that "belief, assertion, and knowledge should be sidelined in favor of acceptance, profession, and understanding" (9). More precisely, "epistemic acceptability [of a belief or proposition] turns not on whether it is true, but on whether it is true enough -- that is, on whether it is close enough to the truth." (16)

When is a belief (or proposition) true enough? Obviously, this cannot be determined in isolation. It depends on the purposes at hand (true enough for what?) and thereby on the context. It is not surprising, therefore, that Elgin favors a holist epistemology (she regularly cites Quine in support of her view). Rather than assessing the epistemic acceptability of individual propositions or beliefs, we should assess the acceptability of what she calls an account, that is, "a fairly comprehensive theory, or system of thought -- a constellation of mutually supportive commitments that bear on a topic." (12). When considering an account as a whole, its tenability is not immediately undermined when some of its elements turn out to be false. But Elgin goes one step further: sometimes falsehoods can even be advantageous -- these are "felicitous falsehoods". Throughout the book she supports this thesis with examples from the sciences, history, the arts, and everyday life. In the sciences, Elgin suggests (and rightly so, I believe) that understanding is often achieved by means of false theories and inaccurate models. Obvious examples are curve smoothing, ceteris paribus claims, and idealizations. When astronomers calculate the motion of the planets, they ignore the detailed structure of the planets, and they may even treat them as point masses instead of objects with spatial extension. In the context of astronomy, it's not a problem that these assumptions are strictly speaking false. On the contrary: not only are they true enough, but such 'falsehoods' are in fact essential to science. Elgin: "Rather than being seen as temporary crutches, modelling and idealization are considered valuable ways to embody scientific understanding" (31). Here Elgin's analysis is in line with current trends in philosophy of science, emphasizing the crucial role of models in science.

Elgin's de-emphasizing of the importance of truth will prompt objections from philosophers of a more traditional inclination. They will ask how we can assess epistemic practices, if not on the basis of truth-conduciveness. Elgin addresses this question in Chapter 5, where she defends a view that she characterizes as a variety of epistemic responsibilism. The core of her view is the idea that epistemic agents are, in Kantian terms, not heteronomous but autonomous: rather than being governed by external norms, agents set their own ends and determine their own norms. But they are always part of an epistemic community that is held together by shared standards. Their norms are developed in a process of reflective deliberation within that community. And their ends should be ones that could be accepted by others in the community. While not all members of the community have to agree on everything, they should be able to defend their claims and commitments by giving reasons for them. It is in this sense that epistemic agents are responsible for their opinions.

This leads Elgin to formulate an epistemic variant of Kant's categorical imperative, the epistemic imperative: "an epistemic agent should accept only considerations that she could advocate and endorse as a legislating member of a realm of epistemic ends." (105). She argues that this imperative vindicates familiar epistemic virtues such as open-mindedness, responsiveness to evidence, and impartiality. Since the epistemic community is central to Elgin's analysis, her account may be regarded as a form of social epistemology. Although she rarely uses the term 'social', her analysis of the division of epistemic labor and the role of testimony reveals that her epistemology is not only holistic but also social in character. Moreover, she follows Helen Longino and Jürgen Habermas in arguing that there are conditions to which epistemic communities should conform. In particular, they should allow for "uncoerced conversation" (119). Without listing them, Elgin apparently agrees with Longino's criteria: recognized avenues for criticism, shared standards, community response, and equality of intellectual authority (Longino 1990, 76-81). Also in line with Longino's view is the emphasis on pluralism: disagreement among members of an epistemic community is not bad, on the contrary: diversity of opinion is an asset, as it extends our epistemic scope (114).

So far, Elgin's discussion of normativity has been quite general and abstract. In Chapter 6, however, she renders it more concrete by zooming in on intellectual integrity, and on research ethics in particular. The starting-point of her discussion is the observation that concepts such as truthfulness and trustworthiness are both evaluative and descriptive. Epistemic agents should be trustworthy, because they depend upon each other in the division of epistemic labor. Elgin argues that such moral requirements are not just external constraints but are partially constitutive of the epistemic ends of a discipline. Scientists, as members of epistemic communities that determine their own epistemic and moral standards, have responsibilities towards one another: they can't break the rules without violating their own principles. Accordingly, scientific misconduct such as fabrication of data, falsification of findings, and plagiarism is inherently objectionable. Elgin admits that her view may seem naïve and perhaps too optimistic. However, she suggests that scientific integrity can be fostered by good science education, in which epistemic and moral standards are internalized: "Learning to do science is learning to do honest, truthful, careful research" (148).

As mentioned above, Elgin advocates a shift from knowledge to understanding, an idea that is now gaining traction in epistemology and philosophy of science (see e.g. De Regt, Leonelli and Eigner 2009; Grimm, Baumberger and Ammon 2017). This fits in naturally with her view on knowledge, since "felicitous falsehoods" obviously cannot represent knowledge but may contribute to understanding. Chapters 3 and 4 present Elgin's theory of understanding. On her view, the fundamental kind of understanding is objectual: we first understand a topic, or a domain, by means of an overall account. Understanding that or why particular facts obtain follows from this and is only secondary. But what does it mean to understand a topic? According to Elgin, understanding is "having a suitable grasp of or take on a topic" (38); and it "involves an adeptness in using the information one has, not merely an appreciation that things are so" (46). In other words, understanding involves know-how.

Again, the main challenge concerns normativity: how to assess whether an account is justified? Here Elgin invokes an idea that also figures in her earlier work: epistemically tenable accounts must be in reflective equilibrium: "An account is tenable just in case it is, or is rationally reconstructible as, a result of a process of adjudication that brings a collection of initially tenable commitments into reflective equilibrium" (64). She illustrates the procedure of achieving reflective equilibrium with an amusing story of the theft of a student's Latin book. Although the statements of various witnesses are by themselves not reliable, they mutually reinforce each other and thereby support the resulting account of the theft. Elgin concludes that when such an account "is grounded in considerations that are collectively as good as any available alternatives, it is an account we can on reflection accept" (85). What remains is the question of what the role of truth is in Elgin's approach. In this respect, her position is somewhat vague and ambiguous. On the one hand, she admits that truth is relevant for understanding: beliefs and commitments have to be "true enough"; and "understanding somehow answers to facts" (37). On the other hand, she doesn't want to privilege truth over falsity, stating that "whether a representation (true or false, . . . ) is acceptable turns on whether it is an element of an account in reflective equilibrium" (89). So it seems that ultimately there is no special role for truth.

So far, I have discussed the central themes of Elgin's book: truth, knowledge, and understanding. But there is much more to be found, and this review cannot do justice to it all. I will focus on Elgin's comparison of science and art, as an illustration of her general philosophical theses. According to Elgin, the traditional opposition between science -- which is allegedly about matters of fact -- and art -- which would be just a matter of taste -- is misguided. Thus, she claims that there can be objectivity in science as well as in aesthetics. Debates about the assessment and interpretation of artworks always involve an epistemic community: an audience with a shared background and shared standards. To be sure, there is less consensus in aesthetics than in science, and controversies in art seem to be interminable. But this is a matter of degree: there is more indeterminacy of interpretation in art. Still, aesthetic disputes can be objective in the sense that reasons can be given for or against an interpretation. Here it should be noted that Elgin adopts a procedural account of objectivity: results are objective if they are products of objective procedures, ensured by public standards of assessment. Such procedures promote trustworthiness because they are devised, tested and certified by epistemic communities. This implies that objectivity doesn't ensure truth and doesn't necessarily lead to consensus: procedural objectivity allows for both agreement and disagreement. This holds for science as well as aesthetics.

Similarly, Elgin contends that aesthetic debates can advance understanding, in the same way as scientific debates do. The crucial notion here is exemplification: an interpretation of an artwork can exemplify a particular feature of it, in the sense of highlighting that feature while downplaying other features. The interpretation thereby affords epistemic access to the work, and provides an understanding of it, from a particular perspective. Elgin illustrates these claims with an extensive analysis of how dance can exemplify, and thereby enhance our understanding of, a wide variety of features in the world. Subsequently, she argues that scientific understanding is achieved in a similar way. Both laboratory experiments and thought experiments, for example, highlight particular features of phenomena, thereby affording epistemic access to aspects of reality that would otherwise have remained concealed. Remarkably, Elgin adds that thought experiments are superior to laboratory experiments, because they aren't prone to the kind of confounding factors that might trouble real experiments (232). This does not convince me, however. As her own discussion makes clear, a thought experiment always proceeds from specific, often implicit assumptions and ceteris paribus clauses, which may be equally misleading.

Exemplification is also the key purpose of idealized scientific models. The ideal gas model, on Elgin's account, exemplifies some features of real gases (e.g. basic gas laws) while neglecting other features (e.g. the real shape of the molecules). The model exemplifies by virtue of being an unrealistic representation of gases -- by being a "felicitous falsehood" it provides understanding of real gas behavior. Such understanding, as we have seen above, consists in "having a suitable grasp", and "involves an adeptness in using the information one has". By characterizing understanding in these terms, as know-how or skill to use information, Elgin seems to adopt a pragmatist view. In fact, the idea of "true enough" by itself already appears to entail a pragmatist position, since "true enough" makes sense only with a particular purpose in mind. It is therefore somewhat surprising that Elgin doesn't address pragmatism.

There are various other places where I would have wished to see more discussion of how Elgin positions herself in relation to the views of other philosophers. For example, when she defines the notion of true enough as "close enough to the truth" (16), one is reminded of Popper's idea of verisimilitude (truthlikeness). But we have to guess whether Elgin would endorse a Popperian analysis of true enough. It is only in the final chapter that she cites Popper, when considering the thesis that we learn from our mistakes, but she doesn't address Popper's views on truth explicitly. Another example is her discussion of the potentially relativistic implications of her position. It might be objected that Elgin's thesis that epistemic communities make their own laws and standards entails relativism. She denies this, arguing that not all epistemic communities are equal and that outsiders can "assess standards, methods and claims, using coarse-grained measures that apply across realms" (112). Her brief discussion of this objection would have merited engagement with the existing literature on relativism.

These minor criticisms notwithstanding, this is a wonderful book, written in an elegant and informal style, and replete with stimulating ideas on a wide range of subjects. Elgin keeps alive the legacy of her former teacher and source of inspiration, Nelson Goodman, whose research also combined epistemology, aesthetics, and philosophy of science. Elgin shows that such an approach is more relevant than ever, in philosophy and beyond. With science under attack in today's 'post-truth society', we do not need simple-minded scientism but rather the thoughtful analysis of Elgin, who observes that "the epistemic value of science lies not in the conclusiveness of its results, but in the self-correcting character of its methods and the self-refining nature of its standards." (103)


De Regt, Henk W., Sabina Leonelli and Kai Eigner (eds), Scientific Understanding: Philosophical Perspectives. University of Pittsburgh Press, 2009.

Grimm, Stephen R., Christoph Baumberger and Sabine Ammon (eds), Explaining Understanding: New Perspectives from Epistemology and Philosophy of Science. Routledge, 2017.

Longino, Helen E., Science as Social Knowledge. Princeton University Press, 1990.