True to Our Feelings: What Our Emotions Are Really Telling Us

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Robert C. Solomon, True to Our Feelings: What Our Emotions Are Really Telling Us, Oxford University Press, 2006, 286pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195306729.

Reviewed by Ronnie de Sousa, University of Toronto


Robert C. Solomon died suddenly in early January of 2007, shortly before the official publication date of this book. After some forty other books, many of them about emotions, True to Our Feelings is a fitting testament. For anyone unfamiliar with Solomon's work, it will make an excellent introduction, a fine expression of the passion which he identified with a certain ideal conception of happiness, wisdom, and the good life.

The book has three parts, in which many of the themes of Solomon's teaching over more than three decades are elegantly woven together to make a fresh and coherent whole. In the first part, Solomon elaborates on the existentialist sense of our responsibility for our own emotions, applying that perspective to a number of important emotions. Thus anger can be viewed not so much as a state that overcomes one, but as "a strategy for engaging with the world"; love is neither passive nor blind; compassion and sympathy form the emotional core of human solidarity; and even the nastier emotions have something valuable to contribute. In the second part, Solomon attacks a number of familiar "myths" about emotions, especially mechanical or "hydraulic" conceptions of them as passive feelings, or as unintelligent physiological states. While admirably open to assimilating the contributions of empirical science, he firmly rejects the idea that science could displace meaning. He concedes that "all of our emotional reactions are based in the brain," and that discovering the role of oxytocin and endorphins is "very interesting, to be sure." But a scientific approach to emotions "becomes problematic when it becomes reductionist." (122) In the third part, Solomon turns to the ethical aspects of our emotional life, insisting on the essential importance of emotions to any life worth living, to our sense of ourselves, and to ethical integrity in the pursuit of wisdom.

As befits a self-declared Existentialist, Solomon's conception of wisdom eschews limiting conceptions of human nature. Occasionally, though, he seemed to succumb to momentary relapses of essentialism, as when he insists on listing criteria for distinguishing "love and infatuation" (53). But generally Solomon's broad sense of sympathy places him on the side of diversity, happy to celebrate "the myriad ways in which two people come to fit together." "I often marvel," he remarks, "at the many different ways in which couples work out their lives together, many of which are virtually unimaginable to me." (61)

Solomon's style of philosophizing was not obsessively precise. He tended to quote from his extensive memory rather than carefully checking texts, and he was more interested in wisdom than in rigorous analysis. Yet he was quite capable of penetrating critical analysis. In this book, for example, he presents an admirably destructive critique of the notion of "valence" -- the claim that every emotion is either "positive" or "negative". His argument, he says, "is not that there is no such thing as valence … but rather that there are many such polarities and oppositions" (171). After offering a list of nineteen non-equivalent forms of positive/negative oppositions, he points out that there are many aspects of any given emotion that might be appraised in opposite ways. Thus in love one generally (but not invariably) regards the loved one positively; but we also think of love as something that is (again, often but not invariably) intrinsically pleasant as a feeling. Furthermore, love also may or may not be good for your health, and may or may not lead you to act in a moral or benevolent way. But "emotions are processes" (263), and as such, what we call emotions are sometimes actually complex clusters of actual and potential states, compatible with many different and often incompatible momentary feelings and responses at different times. Hence "the sad truth is that love can sometimes be very bad for you" (172).

In the rest of this review, I will say a little more about Solomon's provocative discussions of love, which may well have got a surfeit of attention in philosophy, and of gratitude, which has not received as much critical attention as it deserves. Both are conditions of which everyone approves, but both raise some disturbing questions. Both are "positive emotions" that richly illustrate the uselessness of that term.

Solomon here argues -- as he has done before -- that love involves a greater element of choice than its description as a "passion" implies. His voluntarist view of love takes that claim to the point of paradox. Falling in love, he insists, "is a process of willful escalation … a matter of choice… . [conditioned by] multiple decisions each of which leads you a little further…" (194). In that way, we can't escape responsibility for undesirable love affairs by claiming to have been swept helplessly away by irresistible passion.

There's an important truth here. But it is only a half-truth: for while we must undoubtedly take responsibility for choices that smoothed the path to erotic love, we can't set out on that path at will. We can decide not to go to dinner, not to kiss goodnight, not to go out alone together rather than with friends, and so forth -- and so be responsible for falling in love when we shouldn't. But in the absence of a spark that is beyond the power of choice to summon, making all the opposite decisions won't manufacture erotic love. Without that crucial spark, one might doubtless embark on a successful marriage, but not aspire to erotic passion.

Solomon has a great deal more to say about love. "Love is not as such irrational," he claims; but sometimes "love crosses the line into irrationality and destructiveness." (56) An example of irrational love is "falling in love with a con-man or a liar, if one can see the truth but refuses to… . It is in such cases that 'love is blind.' But this is not usually the case. Usually, love sees more clearly and deeply, with much more attention to and appreciation of details, than ordinary perception." (56)

Others have made the point that love is or entails a particularly attentive species of perception. Yet the Euthyphro puzzle remains: do we love because the beloved has intrinsically lovable qualities, or do we find the beloved's qualities lovable because we love? In some ways, the latter is true: we "bestow" certain qualities on the beloved in much the way that Stendhal describes when he compares it to the accretion of crystals undergone by a twig left in the salt mines of Salzburg (54). But Solomon also stresses that we cannot "bestow" just any properties at will. Some qualities -- sensitivity, kindness, intelligence -- are matters of fact. When we mistakenly attribute some of these qualities to someone that doesn't possess them, "we do (or should) depend on friends and family to tell us when we are making a mistake." (56)

That implies that we can love for the wrong reasons. Among "wrong reasons", Solomon mentions "loving someone for his or her money, or connections, or status, or, for that matter, even for his or her looks" (57). By contrast, "'Because we fit so well together' is an excellent reason, and so is 'Because we share the same sense of humor'." But some of the good reasons are odd: "'because we have been together for twenty years' can be a pretty good reason for love, even if there are cases in which twenty years together is a good reason for not loving the person any more." (58)

My own sense of some of those "reasons" is that they might better be termed 'causes'. Though good reasons must be causes, not all causes count as reasons, and perhaps factors such as money or connections, unlike looks, can't even count as causes. When is a cause a reason? Since the very same fact ("twenty years together") can count as a reason both for loving and not, the sense of 'reason' involved can't be logical or evidential. Perhaps it is akin to the way Arnold Isenberg taught us to think of aesthetic "reasons": as indicating not logically or evidentially sufficient conditions, but as indicating the direction in which to look for the appropriate reason or cause.[1] "These curvy lines render this picture so graceful" does not presuppose or imply that curvy lines anywhere will make any picture graceful. It enjoins us to attend to certain features, direct perception of which will cause us to feel its graceful quality. In much the same way, the sorts of reasons we can give for love are not properties that are intrinsically love-justifying. Rather, they draw our attention to what, for that person, in this case, in those particular circumstances, has caused love.

Solomon saw that there is another crucial element which makes human love different from animal affection. One thing I am able to bestow is my attention. And to the extent that the qualities I attend to cause my love, my reflection on those qualities constitutes them as reasons:

Once there is a gap between having an emotion and naming that emotion, there is room for a very special kind of error. In reflection, we can be mistaken about our emotion as well as in our emotional response… we can also … decide that what we do feel is correct and what we think we 'ought' to feel is mistaken. (121)

That, it seems to me, is a deep insight about the nature of reasons in love, and indeed into the peculiarly human quality of human emotion, linked to the human faculty of reflection rooted in language.

When love fails, gratitude is sometimes "the next best thing." By thinking of all the ways in which one is indebted, we can systematically coax ourselves into gratitude more easily, at any rate, than into love. And yet, in one of those subtle reversals to which many emotions are prone, that strategy can sometimes induce resentment instead. On Nietzsche's view, Solomon observes, resentment is the emotion of the weak: "Where envy sees itself in an inferior position, not having what it really wants and unable to get it, resentment rationalizes this inferiority as oppression, and in so doing grants to itself a kind of moral superiority." (109) And being in someone's debt could be rationalized as a kind of inferiority, leading to resentment -- a kind of dual of gratitude. Merely attending to what one owes to another does not determine the valence of one's response.

The last couple of pages of True to Our Feelings are devoted to a eulogy of gratitude. Here too, he brings up a paradox, citing Nietzsche's exclamation, "How could I fail to be grateful to my whole life?" which raises the question

to whom one should feel this gratitude. As an emotion, gratitude is defined, at least in part, by its "object" namely the reception of a gift of some kind… . If a good friend gives me a book, I am … grateful to him… . But if spirituality need not include a belief in a personal God, then how can one be grateful for one's life and all its blessings? (269)

In reply, Solomon urges a dissociation of the emotion of gratitude from any target at all. I think that is essentially right. But out of characteristic kindness, he refrains from making the case against the sort of gratitude he attributes to "most Christians, Jews, Hindus and Muslims." (270) Perhaps out of respect for what is commendable about the religious sensibility, he misses a chance to show that there is something deeply wrong with gratitude to a higher power.

For my part, having long passed the age at which most human beings who have ever lived are dead, I feel gratitude every day for being alive. But if I thought some God was to be thanked for that, as opposed to brute luck, I'd worry about the gross unfairness of it. Why should God privilege me, while condemning millions of innocent people to early and often horrible deaths? Religious gratitude seems to me deeply deplorable, in a way epitomized by the survivor of a plane crash who, while being interviewed by a TV crew, exclaimed "Now I really know that God exists -- because he saved me!" In the event, about half of the other passengers had died. That lucky man seemed untroubled by the question: Why should I be spared when so many are not? He must suppose that he merits the special attention of the Creator of the Universe -- a sentiment that in the guise of humility evinces heights of arrogance beyond Satanic pride. Or else he must assume that God's grace is indeed, as some theologies seem to proclaim, entirely arbitrary. To which the proper response is not gratitude but embarrassment and shame.

Feeling lucky, by contrast, does not manifest the same megalomaniac egotism. Since no one is responsible for my good fortune, there is no one to blame for its unfairness. The paradox, then, is that in "feeling grateful for being alive", the emotion I experience certainly seems to have the structure of a familiar emotion, requiring an intentional agent as its target; yet it avoids deserving shame or disgust only if that agent target is absent.

That is not, of course, the only paradox about our attitude to luck. I have sometimes caught myself thinking: "Solomon was lucky to die in the flower of his age, enjoying the height of his intellectual powers." But wouldn't he have been a lot luckier if he had enjoyed them for a few decades longer? The logic of luck is funny like that. We contextualize the event under consideration in a way that takes account of a change in baseline, and what we regard as a baseline is determined by unexpected events that have dislocated the previous baseline.

What, then, might the appropriate baseline be? The Euthyphro dilemma arises in connection with the baseline of luck, no less than it does about love or the pious. Is the baseline in terms of which we regard ourselves as lucky or unlucky an objective one, which justifies our attitude? Or is it merely a projection of that attitude itself? There is an element of luck in the very fact that we are able to take this view of our situation rather than that. Against Solomon's uncompromising emphasis on responsibility, it might be claimed that essential luck is involved in the very fact of being able to take ourselves to be responsible.

Among the many ways in which Solomon personally influenced many lives for the better is his injunction, in this book and throughout his life, that people should assume responsibility for themselves. Many readers of this book, suddenly awakened to their own freedom, may do just that. But how lucky for them that Solomon was there to make them see it. And how unlucky for all of us that he can no longer do so in person.

[1]Isenberg, A. 1949. "Critical Communication." Philosophical Review 54(4).