Truly Human Enhancement: A Philosophical Defense of Limits

Placeholder book cover

Nicholas Agar, Truly Human Enhancement: A Philosophical Defense of Limits, MIT Press, 2014, 214pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262026635.

Reviewed by Leonard M. Fleck, College of Human Medicine, Michigan State University


"This is the age of human enhancement" (1). So begins Nicholas Agar's most recent book. Agar wishes to distinguish what he labels "radical enhancement" from "moderate enhancement." Moderate enhancement improves attributes or abilities "to levels within or close to what is currently possible for human beings," while radical enhancement improves attributes or abilities "to levels that greatly exceed what is currently possible for human beings" (2). Agar sees himself as a strong critic of all forms of radical enhancement and accepting of some forms of moderate enhancement that yield what he refers to as "truly human enhancement." He acknowledges that there might well be some vagueness between these two broad categories. But he will still argue that the clear cases of radical enhancements should be rejected for both moral reasons and reasons of prudential rationality.

Radical enhancements are about what Agar calls "transformative change." He illustrates that notion by asking us (older folks) to recall the 1956 movie Invasion of the Body Snatchers. In it, aliens snuggle up to sleeping humans and completely take over their minds and bodies, though these now transformed alien-humans retain their same psychological identity, i.e., all their personal memories. However, their values are now the values of the aliens with which they have completely identified. They have no ability to critically assess those values. On the contrary, they quickly go about seeking to convert other humans into alien-humans. The change is radical and transformative because these individuals have lost their humanity. They are no longer capable of love, ambition, desire or faith. The alien-humans feel life is enormously better without the negative life experiences (rejection, failure, frustration, fear of hell) associated with these all-too-human emotions. They are able to cooperate much more readily and accomplish glorious things collectively, which is how they seek to persuade humans to become instead alien-humans.

I must confess that I have never seen this movie, but I have taken note of its production year. This was the height of the anti-Communist (godless, selfless, hate-filled, anti-capitalist) era. Americans who espoused a Communist ideology were regarded as having been duped (brain-washed), their minds taken over by this alien ideology while their critical faculties were asleep. Worse, they quickly became ardent advocates of this alien ideology that promised a utopian life of sharing free of the selfish acquisition and de-humanizing competition that was the hallmark of capitalist societies. I imagine that the early Christians were comparably irritating to the Romans who feared that these all-loving (brain-washed) Christians would welcome barbarians into the Roman Empire. I also imagine that the civil rights advocates (brain-washed) of the sixties were more than a little annoying to southerners in the United States who simply wanted to preserve the safety and security of their segregated society from the chaos that would surely follow racial integration. We might argue about whether or not the social changes to which I allude represented "transformative change" as Agar imagines it, but certainly it is true that anti-Communists, Romans, and southern segregationists saw the changes they resisted as radically transformative and threatening to their fundamental values. I make this point because I wonder whether Agar is in a comparable position with regard to his concerns regarding radical enhancement.

Much of the literature about human enhancement has focused on the genetic alteration of humans, parents turning their children into commodities by manipulating their embryonic genome in order to produce "designer babies." For Agar that discussion is only minimally relevant. For him it does not matter whether radical enhancement is accomplished through genetic means or through environmental means or through technological means (neuro-implants that would increase human intellectual capacities a thousand fold). What matters is that the outcome is the creation of attributes or abilities that greatly exceed what is now possible for humans. The broad examples that he gives include the following. Imagine giving humans the strength and endurance to run a marathon in fifteen minutes. Imagine giving humans the ability to live a thousand years. Imagine giving humans intellectual abilities that were a thousand times faster, more accurate, more insightful, and more creative than any human is capable of now. Imagine enhancing human moral capacities to such an extent that such individuals would have to be regarded as having superior moral status as "post-persons." That is, they were beyond weakness of will and moral mistakes, not to mention outrageous immoral cruelty. Agar wants to reject all these things as desirable future states of affairs if they are achieved through some form of radical enhancement.

Agar does not doubt the instrumental value of these possibilities. If we were endowed with super-enhanced intellectual capacities, science would advance at a breath-taking pace. More importantly, medicine would advance dramatically. We would have cures for cancer and heart disease, as well as every other obscure disease that afflicts humankind at present. This would improve both economic productivity and the quality of the lives of individuals who otherwise would have suffered at length and died prematurely. Surely these would be desirable things to achieve for Agar and the rest of us. Still Agar offers moral and prudential arguments for saying that we should not embrace any human enhancements that might make these outcomes possible.

What Agar sees as being lost is the intrinsic value of many of these activities. He calls attention to Deep Blue, the computer that beat Garry Kasparov. Deep Blue had 700,000 chess games embedded in its memory and could evaluate 200 million chess positions per second. If that capacity could be embedded in a chip that was embedded in someone's brain, that person could compete with Deep Blue on a fair footing. But Agar argues that something intrinsically humanly valuable would be lost, namely the experience Kasparov would have had developing his chess talents over time. And the very point of the game would be lost if every chess player had these same chess capacities built into his/her brain (or so Agar argues). But there still might be room for human ingenuity in the game. This possibility would only be excluded if built into the brain of every chess player was every logically conceivable game. But that takes us into a fantasy world that has little connection to any real world ethical or social problems regarding enhancement that ought to concern us.

In the real world computers have enhanced human intellectual capabilities enormously, certainly to a degree that "greatly exceeds what is currently possible for human beings," certainly from the perspective of those living at the end of the eighteenth century. So could Agar's progenitor in the eighteenth century, who brilliantly imagined the possibilities of computers in the twenty-first century, have justifiably condemned such a radical enhancement? Would the intrinsic value of Descartes' mathematical genius have been diminished if today's computers were available to him then? I must confess that I do not find Agar's very speculative arguments in this regard especially persuasive. If our future descendants are so extraordinarily brilliant that they would find themselves bored by medical and mathematical problems we find almost unsolvable, then presumably their brilliance would allow them to find other problems that were suitably challenging for their brilliance.

How should we think about the radical enhancement of life expectancy to two hundred years or a thousand years? Agar writes: "Sustaining identity over two hundred years and beyond just doesn't seem part of the design specification of a normally functioning human memory" (61). He imagines we would have forgotten who we were at age sixty or age one hundred. He writes: "But nevertheless, as our brains undergo enhancement, the reconstructive capacities central to the maintenance of autobiographical memories are affected" (63). Maybe this would be true, maybe not. This is a very speculative bit of psychology with little evidential support. So I could imagine instead that part of the enhancement process would strengthen the associative bonds of personal memory across long stretches of time. My speculation would seem to have as much validity as his speculation. Agar often appeals to science fiction literature in an effort to strengthen the plausibility of his case. But science fiction is fiction, often imaginative and engaging fiction but not the stuff of compelling moral argument.

Agar is concerned that if we had very long life expectancies to look forward to we would give up many ordinary pleasures of life, such as traveling to exotic locations or driving fast sports cars because all of these things would be perceived as being "too dangerous" (114). That is, we would put at risk hundreds of possible life-years if we were to travel to an exotic place where we consumed some food that proved fatally poisonous. Again, this looks like speculative psychology. In this case it does not even appear to be well-founded speculation. As things are now, tens of thousands of young people do all manner of dangerous things that often result in death. They lose the rest of their lives. Why should we think that these motivational mechanisms, whatever they are, would be altered by radical life extension? It is easy to imagine a young person thinking, "Why should I want to live a perfectly safe but depressingly boring life for three hundred years? Better to burn brightly briefly and then flame out!"

Agar does offer a moral argument against radical life enhancement. He asks how we might imagine acquiring the medical knowledge that would allow us to achieve radical life extension. We would obviously have to do some carefully controlled experimental trials. But could we really expect to "get it right" with whatever the first medical efforts were? The vast majority of new drugs today end in failure. What failure often means in these clinical trials is that individuals suffer horrible side effects or die. Agar asks, in effect, why would any relatively young healthy individual want to risk losing the rest of her life in one of these clinical trials? He concludes that few young, healthy, economically secure individuals would willingly take such risks to advance medical science. Instead, we would end up paying the poor and desperate to serve as "anti-aging guinea pigs" (114) in these trials. That is, they would be "willingly" exploited by the relatively well-off, who would be the real beneficiaries if these trials proved successful. This is obviously immoral. It would involve violating virtually every moral constraint currently in place for acceptable clinical trials. And if this were the only means available for achieving radical life prolongation, then that goal would have to be given up. Both Agar and I agree on that point. But again all of this is very speculative. The moral argument is sound if future facts prove to be true; otherwise, the moral argument is irrelevant. The better moral argument discussed by Agar is a justice argument. We can hardly justify spending public research dollars for radical life extension research if the cost of so doing is slowing medical research seeking cures for many life-threatening diseases that currently afflict patients.

The final topic addressed by Agar is moral enhancement. Chapter Eight is titled "Why Radical Cognitive Enhancement Will (Probably) Enhance Moral Status." Agar starts this chapter by distinguishing moral disposition enhancement from moral status enhancement. If radical cognitive enhancement resulted in enhanced moral dispositions, a greater capacity for making well-justified moral choices, this would not be especially problematic for Agar. We want humans who are better able to consistently make good moral decisions. But moral status is a very different matter.

As things are now, Agar notes, everyone identified as having the moral status of a person has that status equally. There are no degrees of moral status. The moral rights of individuals who are consistently committed to honoring the Kantian categorical imperative in their lives do not have moral rights that are "more inviolable" than the moral rights of Kantian moral slackers who often fail to honor the Kantian categorical imperative. But Agar's concern is that individuals who will have been radically cognitively enhanced will have such extraordinary moral insight and commitment that they will have to be thought of as "post-persons," that is, individuals who would have a superior and distinctive moral status. As things are now, Agar points out, there are three degrees of moral status: non-sentient entities, such as rocks; sentient entities, such as cats and dogs; and human beings. Persons can destroy rocks or kill animals in medical experiments seeking a cure for cancer, and do so in good conscience, because such things are done for the sake of persons, entities with a higher moral status. If this is the moral logic we embrace, and if post-persons embraced that same logic, then persons too could be sacrificed for the sake of very important goals of post-persons. That the moral rights of persons could be put at risk in this way is sufficient reason in Agar's mind for concluding that radical cognitive enhancement must be rejected.

Agar supports the above conclusion with this argument. If a cat and a person were in a burning building, and if only one could be saved, and if someone were to save the cat instead of the person, we would conclude that person had made a serious moral mistake because that cat had less in the way of moral status than the person. Agar's concern is that if a person and a post-person are in a burning building, and only one can be saved, then post-persons (and persons) would be morally obligated to save the post-person because she would have superior moral status. This is an unpalatable conclusion for him, and hence, a reason for rejecting the radical cognitive enhancements that could create such post-persons.

However, there is again considerable speculative thinking embedded in Agar's argument, and I am not certain that I find such speculation persuasive. To be more specific, we have individuals such as Peter Singer defending what has been termed an "animal rights" perspective. That is, he believes we (persons) have sadly misjudged the moral status that ought to be attributed to animals. Singer might well be right. We may be guilty of an unjustified form of speciesism. What if post-persons with their superior moral sensibilities were to conclude with moral certainty that Singer is correct in his judgments regarding the moral worth of animals? The practical implication of that moral insight would be that post-persons would treat persons with greater moral sensitivity than persons currently treat animals. Agar's speculative moral concerns would be misplaced. Post-persons would not represent a moral threat to the rights or interests of persons.

To conclude, I do not have any strong moral views regarding radical enhancement. It is much too vague and speculative to provide solid footing for making moral judgments about whether or not society ought to permit research aimed at achieving any of the sorts of radical enhancement discussed by Agar. I have a reasonably good sense of how we might assess current efforts to do human gene therapy from a moral point of view because this research is occurring and has had real world consequences that can be assessed with the moral tools we now have available. This is precisely what is not available with regard to speculative efforts at radical human enhancement. Perhaps moral philosophers should leave such speculation to science fiction writers.


My thanks to Mitchell Pawlak, my professorial assistant, for thoughtful conversation that facilitated the writing of this review.