Truly Understood

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Christopher Peacocke, Truly Understood, Oxford University Press, 2008, 341pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199239443.

Reviewed by D. Gene Witmer, University of Florida


The theory of concepts is as contentious as any in philosophy, and it undoubtedly benefits from any sustained investigation of how a particular approach might, in detail, be worked out. Much of Christopher Peacocke's work over the last few decades can be seen in this light. His approach, as is well known, is Fregean in spirit, holding to the key idea that features of concepts must reflect rational relations between thoughts, and that a person's grasp of a concept must be grounded in her satisfying epistemic conditions -- such as that of finding certain inferences primitively compelling.

In his most recent book, Truly Understood, Peacocke's focus is on the role of truth and reference in the grasping of concepts. As he puts it, his "principal claim" is that reference and truth "have an explanatory role to play in the nature of understanding and concept-possession, an explanatory role that is deeper and more extensive than is commonly envisaged" (1). The book divides into two parts. In the first, "A Theory of Understanding", Peacocke focuses on this principal claim, motivating it and situating it in a more general framework continuous with the theory of concepts he has developed over the years. The book opens in a dialectical fashion, criticizing (in chapter 1) those theories of concepts that limit their explanatory resources to what the speaker understands by way of justification relations; the target here is mostly Dummett. The upshot is that a thinker's grasp must include something more substantial -- something that gives truth and reference a crucial explanatory role. The second chapter presents the main positive thesis about the explanatory role of reference, whereas the third looks to the first-person concept as an extensive case study to illustrate the thesis. The fourth chapter draws on older material to introduce the notion of "implicit conceptions" and makes plain how the current approach dovetails with the earlier motivation for insisting on such conceptions.

In the second part of the book, "Applications to Mental Concepts", Peacocke considers several mental concepts, leading systematically from the concept of a conscious state in general (chapter 5), to the concepts of perception, action (chapter 6), mental action in particular (chapter 7), and finally to those used to represent thoughts and concepts themselves (chapter 8). This two-part structure may seem rather arbitrary at first; why illustrate the main thesis by focusing only on applications to mental concepts? Those dubious about the prospects of investigating concepts in Peacocke's fashion may be especially keen to see how he would handle concepts not usually investigated by philosophers. However, the fact that the culminating chapter focuses on the concepts used in representing thoughts themselves suggests an underlying strategy behind this organization. After all, it seems that Peacocke owes us, ultimately, an account of how his general theory of concepts is to be linked to how ordinary thinkers conceive of concepts, and the material in that last chapter provide the tools for such an account. The result is a book deserving of very careful study.

A great deal of ground is covered in Truly Understood, and my review will need to be selective. My main focus will be on key claims made in the first part of the book, though I should stress that I found much of the discussion of mental concepts both illuminating and often rather persuasive. It is Peacocke's general approach to concepts that is most controversial and important, however, and I will be concerned to get clear on his thesis about the explanatory role of reference and how this relates to his other commitments regarding possession conditions for concepts and the role of "implicit conceptions." I will close with some briefer remarks on some of the specific claims about mental concepts made in the second part of the book.

So just what is the explanatory role of reference (and thereby truth) on which Peacocke focuses? In brief, the main idea is that each concept is individuated by a rule of reference, and this rule helps explain those rational norms that are distinctive of that concept. If for a concept C, the referent of C is determined by a rule R, then, if there is a distinctive norm regarding what one should conclude about when something does or does not fall under C, rule R may help explain why this norm governs that concept. Peacocke's claim is not that rule R will do all the work in explaining why those norms apply, as facts about the character of the world may play an indispensable role as well. The point is that the norms are rendered explicable in a way that is illuminated by what it takes for the thoughts involving C to be true.

As Peacocke points out, this claim is implied by two other views to which he was already committed:

The first, Fregean, view is that the essence of a concept is given by the fundamental condition for something to be its reference. The fundamental condition for something to be the reference of the concept is what makes the concept the concept it is. The second view is that there are reasons or norms distinctive of a given concept, where these reasons or norms depend upon the nature of the concept. If both these views are correct, it follows that for each concept, there is some condition that gives its reference, and which, since that condition gives the essence of the concept, must contribute to the explanation of anything derivative from the nature of the concept, including the norms or reasons distinctive of it. (54-5)

In what way, then, does Peacocke's project in this work differ from his previous work on concepts? While there are some substantive changes in his view, he sees his goal here as showing how this thesis could be true. "How can what is often a rich set of norms distinctive of a concept be explained by something as apparently austere as a rule of reference?" (55).

How serious this challenge is depends on the extent to which there really are such rich and distinctive norms; on some approaches to the theory of concepts, there are likely few such norms in need of explaining. For Peacocke, however, it seems that there are bound to be such norms. On his view, a concept is individuated not just by its rule of reference but also by its possession conditions. Those conditions must be rich enough to distinguish distinct concepts. It is hard to see how they could be thus discriminating without supposing there are such distinctive norms, norms that must be recognized in some fashion by thinkers in order to possess the concept. There is, then, a substantial task ahead for the theorist who adopts Peacocke's main thesis.

By way of meeting that task, Peacocke offers a sampling of styles of explanation (in chapter 2) and a prolonged examination of one particular case, the first-person concept expressed by 'I' (in chapter 3). In Part Two of the book, in applying his general approach to many mental concepts, we encounter a variety of further illustrations and defenses for particular cases, though much of what we find in that second part is independent of this particular explanatory task.

If the main thesis can be sustained, it is significant in a number of ways. Among those mentioned by Peacocke is one that I believe bears emphasis. He notes that if he is right, then

the contrast found in many writers, either explicitly or implicitly, between theories of meaning and concepts that are "use" theories on the one hand and theories of meaning that involve reference and truth on the other is, in certain basic respects, a spurious contrast. I do not mean that there are not genuinely competing theories of each of these two kinds … My point is rather that if "use" involves norms (as it has to if it is to be adequate in the explanation of meaning and concepts), then explaining why these norms exist will take us back to the level of reference. (73-74)

So-called use theories face any number of problems, but among the most important is a worry about arbitrariness, as it has not been clear just why certain uses should be constitutive. If norm-driven use is explained by appeal to grasp of a central, unifying rule of reference, the sense of arbitrariness can perhaps be dispelled.

The explanatory situation so far might be summed up as follows. On Peacocke's view a thinker S grasps a concept C only if S grasps the rule of reference that determines the semantic value of C. In specifying the possession conditions for concept C one should include the thinker's treating the concept as answerable fundamentally to a certain norm, where this norm is itself explained as the result of the rule of reference for C (in combination, perhaps, with other facts about the world). The norm itself -- that is, the fact that such and such conclusions and inferences are rational -- is explained (in part) by the fact that the concepts involved in those thoughts have those rules of reference.

What, however, of the fact that S possesses the concept C in the first place? On the well-known view developed in his A Study of Concepts (1992), Peacocke intended the possession conditions for a concept C to play this explanatory role: it is in virtue of a thinker's meeting those conditions that she grasps concept C. The conditions in question could be spelled out, it was hoped, in a way that did not presuppose an attribution of the concept to the thinker. If the conditions were thus spelled out, they fit what he called the "A(C) form" constraining the theory of concept possession. This is not a constraint he continues to impose, however, given the role of what he calls "implicit conceptions." As he now sees it, any adequate account of the way in which a person is guided by his understanding in assessing and making inferences of various sorts, including especially the ability to recognize newly formulated principles as valid, requires an account of that understanding according to which it is a kind of tacit knowledge. A statement of possession conditions will, then, include attributing to the thinker some knowledge the content of which essentially includes the very concept at issue. As a result, such statements violate the A(C) constraint.

As Peacocke points out, this scaling back of theoretical ambitions does not mean that the conditions one can spell out are trivial or theoretically uninteresting. He writes:

Violations of the A(C) form are unobjectionable in the explication of a concept F because one can use one's own mastery of the concept F to assess what someone with an implicit conception involving F could be expected to think or do in any given state of information. This is why a statement about what is involved in possession of a concept, and which does not respect the A(C) form, is not vacuous. It still makes an assessable claim. Each one of us, in evaluating the claim it makes, draws on his own mastery of the concept F in being explicated. One draws on that mastery, and engages in simulations to assess what one would be obliged, or rational, to think or do in any given state of information. (145)

While what Peacocke says here seems right, it understates the degree to which the project of providing possession conditions has now shifted ground, in that the goal is no longer, apparently, to explain what it is in virtue of which a thinker possesses a concept. If we no longer aspire to such an explanation, just what is the point of a statement of possession conditions?

Here's one way to press the worry. Suppose that grasping a concept C requires having tacit knowledge of a rule of reference. In that case, we can spell out a possession condition for C just by describing that bit of tacit knowledge. Having such knowledge requires that the thinker already grasp the concept C, so this condition is (trivially) sufficient for grasping C. Since this is a case of a necessary requirement on possessing the concept, the condition is necessary as well. In light of this, it's not clear what point there would be in discerning any other possession conditions; we've already specified one that is both necessary and sufficient.

The explanatory project that Peacocke seems now to be engaged in is not that of explaining what it is in virtue of which a thinker grasps a concept but, instead, taking such for granted, and explaining why it is a consequence of the need for that tacit knowledge that various other conditions are necessary for possessing the concept. If a condition is necessary for possessing concept C, then the fact that it is necessary should be explicable as the consequence of the fact that grasping C must involve tacit knowledge of its rule of reference -- just as facts about the norms distinctive of a concept should be explicable as a consequence of the fact that the concept has such and such a rule of reference.

This way of seeing his project reveals an important possibility. Earlier, I noted that on some views of concepts there will be very little by way of associated distinctive norms. Similarly, on some views, there will be little by way of interesting conditions necessary for possessing a given concept. Apart from such theories, further, one may wonder whether there are any interesting possession conditions to be explained in the first place -- even granting Peacocke's basic premises. Consider the following scenario: all concepts are indeed distinguishable from each other by their possession conditions, but those possession conditions distinguish them in a very simple fashion. For each C, what it takes to possess C is just tacit knowledge of the rule of reference for C, and nothing else in particular is needed for, or follows from, that possession. I don't mean this point as an objection to Peacocke's view; the point is just that it is surprising to see that his approach could accommodate this possibility.

Whether this is really possible may depend on what sorts of rules of reference are possible and what it might take to have tacit knowledge thereof. Peacocke does not offer us anything by way of a general principle constraining what these rules might look like, though they are illustrated through his examination of several particular cases. He does tell us, regarding the class of implicit conceptions that amount to tacit knowledge of the rule of reference, that

it is sufficient for an implicit conception to fall in this target subclass that it contribute to the specification of the reference of the concept in question. The content of the implication conception may or may not include such notions of reference and truth in providing this contribution to the specification of reference. (114)

This remark seems designed to ensure maximal flexibility in how such tacit knowledge is to be understood. One point we are apparently meant to take away from this is that such tacit knowledge need not be meta-conceptual in content; it need not be the case that what the person knows is something about concepts, truth, or reference per se. This would be an advantage, of course, since requiring such sophisticated tacit knowledge would prima facie hurt the plausibility of the theory.

Still, it is unclear whether this modesty can be retained. Peacocke describes the "fundamental rule of reference" for a concept as "the rule that specifies what makes something the reference of the concept" (56); but he also distinguishes this from "the intuitive notion of what it takes to be F" for some predicate 'F' (58). What the possessor of a concept expressed by F knows, then, is not what it takes to be F but what it takes to be the reference of that concept -- and that certainly threatens to be irreducibly meta-conceptual in content.

Whatever form such knowledge has, however, there remains the question of whether there is some explanation to be had of such knowledge, some account of what it is in virtue of which a person has that tacit knowledge. Whereas Peacocke argues against the possibility of what he calls a "purely personal-level conceptual-role" theory -- presumably, the sort of thing hoped for in A Study of Concepts -- he does offer some hope for an explanatory account when he suggests appealing to empirical psychology and the sub-personal level:

In the case of functionalism, we regularly distinguish, following Block, between analytical functionalism, and 'psychofunctionalism', which takes into account information from an empirical psychology in individuating functional roles. We should make a similar distinction between types of conceptual-role theory. A conceptual role theory may be a 'psycho-conceptual-role theory'. It may state that what is involved in possessing a particular concept includes the requirement that certain of the thinker's personal-level applications of that concept be explained by subpersonal representational states, ones which could be regarded as realizations of what I would say is an implicit conception. (137)

The remarks here are of course programmatic, but it's worth pointing out that the analogy with psychofunctionalism seems askew. For that analogy to be sustained, the position imagined would need to suppose that empirical psychology can specify conditions such that those conditions are necessary for, and explanatory of, possessing a concept, whereas the remarks here suggest that empirical psychology would only tell us which states could serve as realizations of implicit conceptions, not which conditions must be met in the first place to count as possessing the concept.

Be that as it may, it is not unreasonable to hope that some explanation of how one both possesses the concept and has the required tacit knowledge might be forthcoming; if it is compelling to suppose that there is such tacit knowledge, then there is nothing wrong with seeing what further theoretical results one can achieve while appealing freely to such tacit knowledge as an explanans. To this end, the several applications to particular concepts are indicative of real progress.

Let us turn, then, to some of those applications. The first (chapter 5) is to the concept of a conscious mental state. Peacocke advances an account that attributes to thinkers tacit knowledge the content of which makes crucial reference to an identity. The account builds on the discussion offered in the first chapter. Following the critique of "justificationist" theories of concepts, we are offered a realistic alternative account of the understanding thinkers have of many ordinary concepts. That alternative includes what Peacocke calls the "identity component" of tacit knowledge required for those concepts. For the concept oval, for instance, the thinker must know this:

For an arbitrary thing to be oval is for it to be of the same shape as things of this sort

where "this sort" expresses a recognitional capacity "exercised when the thinker is presented in perception with a thing as oval-shaped" (31). On this proposal, the thinker's grasp of same shape must play an explanatory role; it is not a mere epiphenomenon of already grasping oval in combination with certain truisms about sameness of properties. The account of our grasp of the concept of a conscious state likewise appeals to a thinker's grasp of identities. In brief, he proposes that the key bit of tacit knowledge involves two identities, as indicated by the following formulation:

For x, distinct from me, to be in pain, is both:

for x to be something of the same kind as me (a subject); and also

for x to be in the same state I'm in when I'm in pain. (175)

One advantage of this account is that it makes sense of the idea that we grasp the concept pain from our own case while allowing a straightforward treatment of applications of the concept to other minds (180). Another more general advantage -- one that will accrue to his accounts of other mental concepts -- is that it does not require that thinkers have any grasp of any functional role played by mental states (222).

An important question about this approach concerns the way in which the thinker's presumed grasp of "same state" and "same kind" is pressed into explanatory service. Peacocke defends this move, remarking at one point that "[i]dentity of state is a notion in good standing, and as such is graspable by a thinker capable of being in conscious states and with a conception of multiple subjects of experience, without any need for a reduction to something else" (179). This seems fair enough in light of the fact that we are no longer trying to provide an account of what it is in virtue of which a thinker grasps these concepts. Given this point, however, one may wonder why an account like that above is needed in the first place. After all, why not say that the notion of pain is a notion in good standing and say that there is nothing by way of interesting possession conditions for that concept? To press this a bit, note that Peacocke points out that "same state" in the above account really needs to mean "same conscious state" (180) -- so the kind of concept taken for granted here is more discriminating than it may have first seemed. If that can be taken for granted, why not the concept pain itself?

As I understand the logic of his project, Peacocke needs not only to advertise the virtues of the accounts he offers of particular concepts but, further, to offer a comparative evaluation. To revert to the main thesis, are there norms involving the use of the concept pain that are better explained by the above account than one that simply takes the concept for granted? (Taking it for granted, here, in effect means to offer nothing by way of possession conditions other than tacit knowledge of a rule of reference.) This is not, however, a project undertaken in Truly Understood.

The next chapter focuses on concepts of perception and action, developing an account of rational self-ascription of mental states and events that can be shown both to be explanatorily powerful on its own and to dovetail with the approach invoking identity relations at center stage in the previous chapter. Central to the account is what Peacocke calls the "Core Rule," which might be very roughly glossed as a rule leading from the event of seeing that p to the judgment that one sees that p, where if one follows this rule under the right circumstances one thereby gains knowledge that one sees that p. One especially useful aspect of this account is that it can be used to explain some empirical phenomena involving infants' attributions of mental states to others (229-237).

The Core Rule is generalized so as to apply to basic actions, and this provides a natural link to the next chapter in which it is argued that many mental events (not all) are best understood as actions. The upshot is that an account of self-knowledge is built up in a systematic fashion. The account has a great deal of attractive features, though the explanatory role of reference is not on much display throughout. It returns to a more prominent position in the final chapter, "Representing Thoughts."

Peacocke's account of the concept concept is introduced by considering a well-known debate about the semantics of iterated propositional attitude attributions, here transferred to the level of thought. If Amy believes that Basil believes that snow is white, should we suppose that the concept corresponding to "snow" in Amy's thought is a higher-order concept -- one that refers to a concept -- or that it is instead the concept that we normally express with the word "snow"? Peacocke's response is to opt for the first, higher-order account, but the interesting work here is provided by what he calls "the Leverage Account," according to which, for each concept, there is a canonical concept of that concept, one that can be formed in a systematic way given tacit knowledge necessary for possessing the first-order concept. The Leverage Account -- so-called, presumably, because given the first-order concept one has enough leverage to mount ascending orders of concepts -- is given as follows, where "can(F)" denotes the canonical concept for a concept expressed with "F":

For an arbitrary concept C to fall under can(F) is for the fundamental condition for something to fall under C to be the same as the fundamental condition for something to fall under the concept F. (291)

If a thinker, in possessing concept C, has tacit knowledge of the fundamental reference rule for C, then she can easily form the canonical concept of C by making use of the (tacit) knowledge displayed above. Given the systematic connection between first-order and higher-order concepts, the inferences one can draw from iterated propositional attitude attributes are readily explicable. This systematic connection is also used as a way of trying to resolve worries that an externalist account of content is incompatible with privileged self-knowledge. Higher-order judgments about one's thoughts inherit their contents directly from that of the first-order concepts at work; if you are making use of the canonical concept, then there is no issue about knowing which first-order concept you are using, since, as he puts it, given the Leverage Account, "you know as much about which concept is in question when you think of it as the concept F as there is to know" since "[a]ll the conditions that contribute to the individuation of the concept F itself contribute to the individuation of the canonical concept of F" (311).

I confess to finding the Leverage Account quite appealing, though I here register just two reservations. First, the account only works for concepts for which there is a fundamental condition for something to fall under it, and Peacocke explicitly allows that there are concepts for which there is no such rule of reference (59), yet presumably some accommodation must be made for thoughts about thoughts using those concepts as well. In general, he says very little about the concepts that lack such a rule of reference, and it is a bit frustrating that we aren't given more by way of explicit delimitation and discussion of them. Second, I expressed above some concern about the form of the tacit knowledge of the rule of reference, wondering whether it would have to take a meta-conceptual form. The Leverage Account would seem to forbid this option, as one's concept of the concept would have to be, itself, explained by one's logically prior grasp of the fundamental rule of reference. Knowledge of that rule of reference cannot in turn depend on a prior representation of the concept in question. It is all the more important, then, that we be given a clear account of just what form this tacit knowledge can take.

Despite these worries, I think it undeniable that the sort of general framework that Peacocke here develops has much to recommend it, though there is a need to face squarely two of the questions raised above: Just what form can these rules of reference take? And what are the prospects for explaining the grasp of a concept given the crucial role of tacit knowledge of such rules? However these questions are addressed, Truly Understood is an impressive exploration of the contours and promises of an important approach to thinking about concepts, one that deserves to have a lasting impact on philosophical thought.