Trust, Ethics and Human Reason

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Olli Lagerspetz, Trust, Ethics and Human Reason, Bloomsbury, 2015, 205pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441184870.

Reviewed by Paul Faulkner, University of Sheffield


Olli Lagerspetz's book has two stated aims: "to present a general outline of the philosophical trust debate" (5) and "to develop a view that does justice to interpersonal dependence and trust as central aspects of reason itself" (5). To the first end the book's seven chapters discuss various issues that have been raised in the philosophical debate on trust, which include the analysis of trust, the place of trust in accounts of cooperation, including game-theoretical conceptions of this, the social place of generalized or basic trust, and the role of trust in the epistemology of testimony. With respect to the second end, there is no chapter devoted to presenting Lagerspetz's positive view, rather this view simply emerges from his criticism of the existing debate. For this reader, at least, this is unfortunate because what gives this book its interest and value is Lagerspetz's positive view, which is both original and philosophically interesting. So let me start this review by trying to crystallize the positive view that I think emerges from Lagerspetz's objections.

A central concern for Lagerspetz "is how this vocabulary [of trust] enters human relationships and shapes them." (155) Consider the trust that exists between two friends. The greater the trust, the less likely it is that either party would use the vocabulary of trust to describe their relations. This is because to describe relations as trusting is to highlight certain dependencies or vulnerabilities that are obscured by trust. For example, one friend would not say to another "I trust you not to steal the family silver" (100). To say this would be to imply that the friend could, and indeed might, do so. Since this is a possibility that is rendered invisible by trust, this statement, which purports to declare trust, in fact implies a lack of trust. In identifying vulnerability, "Descriptions are not innocent". (91) They are not innocent when used by speakers, nor are they so when used by theorists. Thus Lagerspetz takes me to task for describing the act of leaving one's diary open on one's desk as trusting (8-9). To describe it thus, he argues, is to make salient a possibility -- that one's partner might read it -- that would not figure in the trusting imagination. "To trust is not to expect betrayal and not to take precautions." (100) It follows that there is a split between first and third party perspectives on a trusting relation, since these perspectives can involve different conceptions and appraisals of risk. But it would be wrong to identify the third party perspective -- that of the theorist -- as the 'objective' perspective: we would describe those that worry about being intentionally poisoned when dining out as "paranoid" (138) even though the possibility of being so poisoned is as real as that of the diary being read or the silver stolen. Thus trust has the property of "dys-appearing" (100): it enters our thinking and talking about our relationships only when a possibility of dysfunction becomes salient. Such matters of salience are both perspectival and contextual, so the statements "A trusts B" and "A trusts B to φ" don't have "stable meanings" (105). Rather, what is meant by these statements changes with utterer and context of utterance. It follows that the attempt to conceptually analyse these statements -- and so give a theory of trust as attitude -- is misguided. One cannot define an attitude of trust; trust is rather a description of the nature of a relationship, which evolve as goals "are set jointly" (16).

Consider, then, an interaction of two parties which involves mutual dependency -- an interaction like the prisoners' dilemma. And suppose that trust is as Lagerspetz takes it to be: not an attitude but a contextual and perspectival description of dependencies. It follows that any question of trust must consider the history of the prisoners' relation, both from each of their perspectives and from a third party's perspective. This stage setting is necessary since, for instance, a promise to remain silent might mean the possibility of 'defecting' is no more visible to the promisor than the possibility of your friend stealing your family silver is visible to you. "I trust the other prisoner to remain silent" is not, thereby, something this prisoner would say though it is a description that would make sense from a third party perspective. But such a backstory goes missing in philosophy: the 'dilemma' is considered "timelessly" (75). Any promises made are discounted: what matters is the present interest in keeping promises. However, this timelessness erases the prisoners' relation and with it how each would think about the situation they find themselves in. This thinking cannot then be reduced to their respective momentary 'interests' since we "take a stand" (43) on what our interest are, and this stand, like the prisoners' relationship itself, is something that will be determined by a history of negotiation. Thus Lagerspetz thinks that there is something pervasively wrong with philosophical thinking on trust. As it is philosophically presented, the prisoners' dilemma involves each prisoner deciding whether to trust, and the issue is the rationality of doing so. Lagerspetz calls this the 'shopping cart' model of trust (157): agents must decide whom to place their trust in, and why. Combined with an 'objective' conception of the ways in which we depend on others -- their not stealing our family silver etc. -- this generates the philosophical problem of trust: how to account for the rationality of cooperation, or depending on others be it practical or epistemic. This problem is then conceived sceptically: once the extent of our dependence is recognized, trust is problematized.

But this whole way of thinking about trust is misguided. Trust is not an attitude, so it is not something that needs justifying. And we are not in a Hobbesian state of nature: there is a society in place with the massive web of relations this entails. All these relations are trusting to some degree or other insofar as they all involve dependencies that salient in some respects and invisible in others. So trust should be thought of "as one of the characteristic aspects of our usually unchallenged background activities, contacts and commitments" (89). Since these contacts and commitments are rationally negotiated, the dependencies, perceived and unperceived, that they involve are the product of these negotiations. Thus, "trust is not external to human reason in the first place but an important aspect of it" (5). Any given interaction will then takes place against this 'background of trust' (129). Moreover this background should not be thought of as a corrective to scepticism about trust -- trust might not be rational but we are primed to trust anyhow (138) -- but should be thought of ethically: to say that there is such a background of trust is just another way of saying that we should, and do, conceive of human relations in ethical language. "trust, ethics and human reason", Lagerspetz concludes, "are internally related." (158)

This is an interesting and original view, which I obviously cannot properly capture in this short space. But let me now express some frustration. I am not really sure what Lagerspetz means when he says that trust and reason are "internally related". I can make sense of this claim in terms of my own theory of trust: adopting an attitude of affective trust entails that one makes a presumption about the trusted's motivations which rationalizes depending on them, or trusting them. I won't fill in the details, I have elsewhere, but I take the claim about internal relation to be correct. However, I can't find the details that allow me to ascertain how Lagerspetz would understand this claim. The problem is that Lagerspetz's presentation and criticism of the existing philosophical debate is all very big picture stuff -- and maybe this is necessary when a shift in perspective is demanded -- but since his positive account only emerges from this criticism, it is left frustratingly sketchy. And maybe I am too wedded to the picture Lagerspetz rejects, but I didn't find his 'contextualism about trust' persuasive (although Lagerspetz would not accept this characterisation since he rejects the project of giving an analysis of trust).

Take my trusting you not to read my diary. It is true I would not say this -- I wouldn't say it because it pragmatically implies that I don't trust you. (It implies this because I use the three-place 'A trusts B to φ', which draws attention to how I depend, but when the dependence is negative -- the trusted's not φ-ing -- we would ordinarily use the two-place: 'A trusts B'. So by not using the two-place form, I imply its falsity; that is, I imply that I don't trust you. There is no "paradox" here (102).) But is it truly said of me by a third party or theorist that I trust you not to read my diary? One must assume that it is, otherwise the conclusion that I don't trust you not to read my diary is reached, which is surely false. But if it is true that I do trust you in this way, then it would seem that it is my attitude towards you that makes it true. It is then reasonable to ask what this attitude is. Lagerspetz is happy to make distinctions. Some uses of trust are merely predictive "as when I trust the weather to stay warm" (20), others are normative. These normative uses contrast with reliance because trust can be betrayed. But, he says, "Differentiating between cases is philosophically important, but legislating about language use is not" (20). Except the attempt to characterise our attitudes is not mere legislation about language; it is part of an attempt to philosophically understand what we are wont to say and do. And without some characterisation of trust, without some analysis, it is hard to make sense of the idea that trust is internally related reason.

In conclusion, there is much to like about this book. And I have not done it justice in this brief review. I've not touched on Lagerspetz's engagement with the epistemology of testimony, or mentioned his introduction of Wittgenstein, K. E. Løgstrup and Peter Winch into the trust debate -- important figures whose neglect is a sorry omission. And Lagerspetz's objections to the contours of the trust debate are really philosophically interesting -- I just wish the book left me with a clearer grasp of an organizing theory, not the rejection of one.