Trust in the World: A Philosophy of Film

Placeholder book cover

Josef Früchtl, Trust in the World: A Philosophy of Film, Sarah L. Kirkby (tr.), Routledge, 2018, 182 pp., $140.00 (hbk) ISBN 9781138708785.

Reviewed by Joseph Mai, Clemson University


Josef Früchtl's book, which originally appeared in German as Vertrauen in die Welt in 2013, is a complex and thoughtful addition to the ever-growing field of film and philosophy. Früchtl explores the idea, first formulated by Gilles Deleuze, that cinema is an art form capable of establishing trust in the world. This is an interesting and original proposition, which suggests that the cinema might bring a widely relevant cultural response to a philosophical problem: the world-negating tendencies of skepticism. As Früchtl reminds us, skepticism is a central strain of the Western philosophical and religious tradition, ranging from Plato's theory of forms to Christianity's insistence on two worlds. Descartes' division between the cogito and the extended universe contributes a salient epistemological expression of the division between identity and the world, one that has only intensified since (for example, in postmodernism). Deleuze takes the full measure of what the cinema must overcome when he calls it, only somewhat facetiously, a "cult."

Given the origins of the idea, it is unsurprising to see that Deleuze plays a central role in Früchtl's work. Similarly, given his interest in skepticism and the cinema, it is no surprise to find the work of Stanley Cavell frequently cited as well. Früchtl also integrates the work of a large number of philosophers, mostly from the Continental tradition, including Benjamin, Nancy, Hegel, Bergson, Agamben, Heidegger, Rancière, Vaihinger, and others, while reserving a privileged place for Kantian aesthetics.

Früchtl begins by recuperating the notion of fiction. If the Greek and Christian tradition treats fictions dismissively as false, Früchtl understands fiction positively, as active doing with an as-if structure, akin to a hypothesis or a necessary pretending, with at least the possibility of being confirmed as true. Deleuze believes that fictions like the cinema have a certain force (14) that restores the autonomy of perception by introducing the body to pure sound and sights. The aesthetic experience of an affect "cleanses" the body of opinion (of predetermined or inherited attitudes toward existence). This belief in the world is not justified: indeed, it is absurd, but absurd in the sense that the existentialists consider the autonomy of existence as a palpable absurdity at the heart of subjectivity. Früchtl emphasizes that this is a process of make-believe: we experience something we know to be a fiction as if it were true (14). Unjustifiability necessarily accompanies all belief. In this way, the skeptical tradition is modestly redeemed by a belief in the body engaged in a world.

This is the point of departure of Früchtl's philosophy of the cinema, which comes to incorporate many thinkers and a wide spectrum of philosophical languages (ontology, ethics, politics, aesthetics, social history, epistemology . . .). In the following eight chapters Früchtl fills in gaps, refines the basic idea, considers its implications in various domains, and raises and addresses objections.

Chapter two begins with the argument that modern identity is always in movement, that the modern subject is always doubled, always in tension, contemplating itself. This allows Früchtl to make a connection between film and subjectivity. Film is, according to a phrase borrowed from Jean-Luc Nancy, a "mobilization of the gaze" (or the "regard" as the French word "regard" is translated, 33). This gives the cinema a "violent dynamic" (33) comparable to the divided structure of subjectivity, which struggles for recognition and autonomy vis-à-vis others, according to Hegel (even if the struggle, as in Fight Club, is self-oriented and self-destructive). Film is a mirror in which a modern subjectivity can contemplate itself.

Chapters three and four both refer to the cinema of Abbas Kiarostami, and are concerned with postmodernism's proclivity for playing with style, narrative patterns, and the reality/fiction dichotomy. Früchtl begins with Deleuze's time-image, which marks a transition from a pre-WWII movement-image (in which sensory-motor habits seemed operative in actions performed in the world) to a loss of connectivity between subject and the world (expressed by the time-image). This is in some ways a radicalization of Descartes' breakdown between res cogitans and res extensa. The postmodern, post-humanist response is to play with codes, either out of despair or, as Jean-Luc Nancy does, in order to produce something. In Nancy's case, that thing is "evidence," (45) which he does not define as essential to secure knowledge, but, in playing with signifiers, as something that "shows out" as we look at it (regard) or have an outlook (égard) upon it (looking back, respecting, looking out for, etc. 46). This is an "unconcealing" of "presence" (47). Kiarostami comes close to this in his "gestural" manner of presenting action. The gesture does not seek out narrative or psychological coherence, but calls attention to itself, saying "see how beautiful I am in my movement" (60). I found the reading of Kiarostami's Close Up valid here, though I thought that Kiarostami's broader œuvre would lend authority to Früchtl's theses and would have liked to see much more about other films.

Chapter five, the longest, delves into different theories of visibility and relates them to politics in the modern period. It begins with Walter Benjamin's loss of the "aura," which marks, for Früchtl, a transition from a "cult" value of art to an exhibitionist value (67). This reflects a political-historical-cultural shift toward equality, in which visibility becomes important: difference is to be shown, and existence becomes a theater of showing. The movie camera, which potentially can make anyone visible, is a dispositive that reflects this political theater.

This chapter includes a technical discussion of Deleuze's very different path toward visibility, or rather toward the "visionary." For Früchtl, the "Schizo" is a "friendly version of the oedipalized schizophrenic who figures the "ethics of the ability to be different" and an "ontology of movement" (74). The latter refers to Deleuze's contention that we do not "discover" aspects of being, but invent them, so that being is always change. To get here, however, Deleuze must rely strongly on intuition, which brings him very close to a mystical position (Früchtl considers Badiou's criticisms of Deleuze, and critiques his version of Spinoza and Bergson), with bothersome ambiguities. Früchtl proposes that pragmatism can help overcome some of Deleuze's mystical positions.

In chapter six, Früchtl returns to a theme he has treated elsewhere: heroism in the modern, "prosaic" age. Heroism still persists conspicuously in popular sport, where individual stars have mastered their game, but also have a public platform and something like an "aura." What we seek, in relation to the hero of the prosaic age (Früchtl takes the French footballer Zinédine Zidane as an example) is, once again, presence, a disclosing. Presence is the way in which a thing sticks out of the empirical flow in a way that elicits acknowledgement. Film and television compensate for a lack of physical proximity/presence by creating visual proximity (through camera technique). I was surprised not to see an analysis of the film Zidane, un portrait du 21e siècle (2006), a documentary depiction of Zidane, frequently in close-up, over the course of an entire match, and therefore very much in harmony with Früchtl's theme in this chapter.

In chapter seven, Früchtl circles back to Deleuze's film philosophy to critique its foundation in Bergsonian temporality. By making a historical distinction between the movement-image and the time-image, Deleuze calls into question how "situations of action" (107) have been treated in moving images. Suddenly, the sensory-motor schema has collapsed, the concept of truth has become clouded, the distinction between subject and object blurred, and Time, the "dimension of the possible, of becoming, of change" becomes dominant (108). Time is politically important to Deleuze because it is the domain of difference and the New. But Früchtl again finds Deleuze's ontology of time unnecessary, too vitalist, too wrapped up in Catholic mystical and metaphysical problems. Instead, he returns to Agamben's theory of the gesture, as a kind of movement that is a means that is also an end, a movement that draws attention to itself as a thing of beauty. Früchtl would like to leave behind Deleuze's metaphysics in order to let his aesthetics resound more clearly.

In chapter eight, Früchtl returns to his emphasis on fictionality, aesthetics, and the "as-if" structure. In my view, it is here that he shows his hand, or at least reveals his strongest affinities: he is trying to reinstitute a Kantian aesthetics that would make up for Deleuze's metaphysical extravagance. According to Hans Blumenberg, Christianity has performed an eschatological destruction of the world, but individuals in the here and now have no choice but to continue to live. By living as if the world were not destroyed, as if there were some kind of connection between us and the world (a connection that is justified by the way the world responds to our fiction), we gradually build up trust. To take a contemporary example, Früchtl looks at Rancière's mixture of politics and aesthetics, in which "a (utopian-anticipatory) demeanour is feigned" (122), in which one pretends one has rights that one may in fact receive. An important part of the justification that the world may give to the as-if structure comes through aesthetic judgment. If something appears "beautiful" to me, this means, among other things, that "man fits into the world" (130). Aesthetic experiences may be weak in epistemological terms, but they build this sort of trust and confidence. Furthermore, through shared aesthetic judgments and affinities, aesthetic experiences develop a broader social confidence: they are the space where a sensus communis is formed. Here again the thinking is Kantian and comes through the political thought of Hannah Arendt.

Früchtl's last chapter is a rich examination of the work of Stanley Cavell. Cavell's opposition to skepticism begins with the understanding that skepticism requires a secure knowledge, and that this secure knowledge will not be forthcoming. There is no response to skepticism that would meet skepticism's requirements. Instead, Cavell gets over it by continuously relegitimizing ties between the individual, the world, and others. In terms of other minds, this happens mainly through acknowledgment: expressive statements of feeling prompt a reaction or reciprocal expression (affinities, in short). Furthermore, the cinema is "a moving image of skepticism": despite being "of the world," it screens me from the world it holds, while allowing me to access it in imagination. The cinema can be considered perhaps the best media in which to address our modern forms of skepticism, from skepticism toward the world to skepticism about others, which it would represent through films, actors, and the various genres that deal with modern life. Früchtl closes with a point about how most people overcome skepticism, in childhood, through the development of trust in the world and others; this trust is not secure and must be constantly renegotiated, but develops in the absence of reason to distrust (see page 159). It is not a question of proving anything, but of trying; not the skeptical question of "why?," but in the words of George Bernard Shaw, quoted by Früchtl, "why not" (22)?

The book is not always an easy read. Früchtl assumes a depth of familiarity with a broad number of thinkers to a degree that renders it dense and difficult. It is furthermore based on lectures written over a period of time, and connections between chapters and sections are not always immediately clear. At other times the book circles back to revisit themes and arguments it has already dealt with, albeit in different contexts. The translator does a very good job at conveying the original German, the sentences of which are clear and precise, but also long and sometimes technical, again slowing the reading (I did note a few misspellings of French terms that are left in the original, mistakes that the editors should have caught). At the same time, anyone committed to understanding the diversity of film philosophy will find enough stimulation here to retain interest.

Some will also find provocation. Perhaps the most critical will be Deleuzians, who may doubt Früchtl's commitment to Deleuze beyond the original formulation of the problem of doubt and the assertion of cinema's power to make us believe. Früchtl expends much intellectual energy in elucidating some central features of Deleuze's film books, but also in sapping them of many elements of Deleuze's philosophy. He finds his Bergsonism faulty, his metaphysics suspect, and his ontology of movement and change unnecessarily mystical. This criticism is, however, open to debate. If much is discarded in Deleuze, the engagement is still deep, thoughtful, and complex, as it is with the numerous other philosophers that Früchtl treats. Still, at times, I wondered if a more straightforward account of the as if and Kantian aesthetics would not serve Früchtl's purposes better; at any rate, it seems clear that Früchtl is more interested in the theories of the gesture, the as-if, aesthetic judgment, the sensus communis, etc. I would add, though I am not a specialist in Kant, that I found Früchtl's injection of Kantian aesthetics into film theory to be an original and indisputably valuable contribution.

In short, this is a serious, ambitious, complex, and intriguing exploration of how the cinema offers to so many viewers an answer to skepticism. As I was reading, my mind returned frequently to an influential essay by André Bazin, in which Bazin compares the photographic image at the basis of the cinema to the Holy Shroud of Turin: the photograph, he wrote, has the "irrational power . . . to bear away our faith."[1] And yet, returning to this comparison after reading Früchtl, one is struck by the self-conscious fictionality of Bazin's writing, for surely Bazin was not secure in thinking that the shroud was in fact the volto santo. He was not comparing the cinema to an irrefutable proof of the historical existence of Jesus, but to a fiction, an as-if, which, like the cinema, could form the basis of trust, as unjustified as it might be.

[1]André Bazin, "The Ontology of the Photographic Image," in What is Cinéma?, tr. Hugh Gray (University of California Press), 14.