Trust of People, Words and God: A Route for Philosophy of Religion

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Joseph J. Godfrey, Trust of People, Words and God: A Route for Philosophy of Religion, University of Notre Dame Press, 2012, 498pp., $49.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268030018.

Reviewed by Paul Helm, Regent College


This substantial volume offers a distinctively new pathway for the philosophy of religion by emphasising the centrality of the idea of trust in such studies. Philosophy of religion is in turn understood as the philosophizing about human religious states. Nowadays I think the phrase 'philosophy of religion' is used somewhat loosely and interchangeably with 'philosophical theology' but Godfrey proposes by implication a return to the older usage. For one thing he stresses the hypothetical character of religion as far as his philosophy of religion is concerned, bracketing the issues of religious and theological truth. What this is to mean in practice is that the philosopher of religion is to treat the data of a particular religion as if that particular religion is, in the sociological sense, true. No less and no more. As far as trust is concerned, Godfrey is in the business of recommending sound practices to adherents of various religions, and not with whether trust (in God, say, or in some distinctive claim of God's) is warranted in any of them. It's not as clear whether this implies that the philosopher should strive to have that degree of empathy with the religion he is concerned with as if he were an adherent of it.

The book has eleven chapters, in the first eight of which the reader is taken through various dimensions and interconnections of trust, and which lead to three chapters of 'application'. Two of these are given to theistic arguments arising from the ineluctability of human trusting, and one, the 'destination' of the book, on religious trust which proposes that a philosopher of religion ought to have a concern with what, in a religion, it is to 'trust well'.

The book is both expansive and tightly woven, in that later discussion requires the reader to have carried forward the earlier findings. After an opening chapter in which the author adjusts and sets his compass, he argues that trust has four dimensions (Chapter 2 and a core Chapter 3). He discusses the relation between analogy and trust (Chapter 4), the ethical and epistemological sides of trusting, and ontology (Chapters 5-8).

Godfrey adopts an avowedly inclusivist style. His policy is to take insights on the diverse aspects of trust from all and sundry without engaging in any argumentative discussion about what may be, and in some cases definitely are, important differences between them and him. Does he favor an 'analytic' approach to the data, or a 'continental' approach? The answer is 'both' or perhaps 'neither'.

He begins the substantive work of the book by distinguishing four dimensions of trusting, reliance trusting, I-thou trusting, security trusting, and openness trusting. The four dimensions of trust (Chapter 2) are of trust in general, not religious trust only. And the dimensions do not take in situations between adults involving highly specific circumstances, such as the terms of a contract, or instinctive trust, like that of an infant.

The procedure that Godfrey has adopted is what used to be called 'conceptual analysis', the making of large-scale distinctions based partly on a regimentation of the data, and partly in what people would say, or are likely to say or typically do say, in certain circumstances. At times the style reminded me of H. H. Price. And in the case of the four dimensions (though not later on in the book) he avoids reference to beliefs, but it seems obvious that the character of trusting largely depends on the presence of propositional attitudes, as well as beliefs about the truster's circumstances. I do not think that he gives this objection to the entire enterprise the airing that it deserves: that what gives a case of trust its distinctive character are the truster's beliefs about what is trusted, and what for, and the circumstances in which trust is exercised.

There is a certain datedness to Godfrey's approach. This is not meant as a criticism, but the reader needs to be aware that the style of the discussion and authors cited tend to be those of yesteryear, as are the allusions. I doubt if very many working in the philosophy of religion nowadays are familiar with the word 'Braithwaitian', an adjective that harks back to the era of intense interest in 'religious language' brought on by the challenge of Logical Positivism.

Chapter 3 offers the reader a distinctive, rival schema of the conceptual structure of the various understandings of trust that Godfrey identifies. The schema offers trusting as involving: belief about the interests of others, vulnerability, desiring and willing, and dependence. I don't think he offers any explanation of why these four understandings are brought together in this way. Do they overlap in some significant way? Are they related to each other in other ways? Does it matter to the viability of the schema whether or not they are related in some clear way? Godfrey's aim is to 'gather together elements of trusting', (87) which at its most general is said to be the state of being 'receptive to enhancement'. (88)

In Chapter 4, 'trusting and analogy', the four dimensions are augmented by a further set of general distinctions, between the different categories of things that are objects of trust, and which result in being concerned with whether trusting in one case bears an analogical relation to trusting in another. Does trusting a human being have an analogical relation to trusting God, and another analogical relation to trusting a parachute?

In Chapter 5 the reader is introduced to the ethical dimension of trusting, of 'receptive enhancement'. Trusting involves the will in a way in which assent to a proposition does not, and so one might think at this point that Godfrey is going to discuss what moral significance this has. But although he notes this question, he is not concerned with responsibility for being trustful of someone or something but with the moral evaluation of the different types or dimensions of trusting that he has identified. In this chapter religious cases come into view more prominently. (133) One trusts a person, not a belief. The remarks that make up this chapter are never more than suggestive, there is no development of a single argument or group of arguments regarding the ethics of trusting, as far as I can see. Godfrey is particularly interested in trusting in situations of inequality (or asymmetry), he stresses the place of knowledge in trusting and yet that trusting goes beyond the evidence. (157)

Chapter 6 centers on epistemology. He raises the question, how does trusting contribute to knowing? (176) There is surprisingly little on the place and importance of testimony. (179) There is a certain amount of going over undisputed territory. He sees propositional attitudes themselves as fiducial, so that there is no sharp distinction between belief and the will; assent involves judgment. But as he points out, having belief is distinct from acting on it. Making a judgment (in which the will is involved) is trusting what is judged to be true. (187)

Chapters 7 and 8 have to do with the development of models, that is, the ontological/causal bases of the various kinds of trust identified earlier. These are put into two groups in Chapter 7: reliance trust as will-nature, with the key idea that of utilization, and I-thou trust as inter-subjective, where the key idea is appreciation. (226ff.) The basic distinction is that I-it trusting is concerned with using, whereas I-thou trusting has to do with fellowship and communion (see, e.g., 237). In Chapter 8 there are models for security-trusting, openness and mediation.

This brings us to the last three chapters. The first of these (Chapter 9) offers what the author calls cosmofiducial arguments for the existence of God. This chapter considers two arguments, a type of 'design' argument found in the work of Richard Taylor, proceeding from the fact of trust, and a ground of trustworthiness argument, from Hans Küng. (268)

By what is argued in these chapters, it may be thought that the earlier mapping-out of trust is over-complex, since all that the arguments (of Chapter 9 at any rate) work with is the basic distinction between openness trust and reliance trust. (276-7) What does introducing the factor of trust add to those cosmological arguments offered by Richard Swinburne, John Haldane and Robert Adams? The emphasis is on the point that in sensing, we trust ourselves, and that from awareness of such trust theistic conclusions follow. Godfrey stresses the connection between such arguments and openness trusting rather than reliance trusting. (291) He discusses the views of Hans Küng in offering a cosmofiducial argument based on the fact of trust, that even the sceptic has. But why bring in God at this point? Why not instead offer arguments against scepticism? (J.L. Mackie)

In Chapter 10 Godfrey considers 'ontofiducial' argumentative approaches, as in the work of Donald Evans. Whereas Küng's argument is said to be an example of reasoning to the conditions of fundamental trust, Evans' argument is that of trying to figure out who or what the truster is dealing with. (318)

I think it is best to think of these two chapters as offering resources for the proposed fiducial 'turn' in the philosophy of religion. Readers will make their own estimate of the likely fecundity of such a turn. In terms of their place in this book, it is hard not to come to the conclusion that these arguments can be discussed independently of most of the work in the earlier chapters.

The final chapter is concerned with religious faith and trust. Godfrey argues for the postion that philosophy of religion should be engaged (in a religiously conditional way) with what it is to trust well (in, e.g., Buddhism, Judaism, Christianity), with what in a religion a person may hope for. This is philosophy of religion's new pathway, presumably. But I found the discussion too general to be insightful. Were it less general it would seem to have ventured out of philosophy into pastoral care. (At one point (375) Godfrey mentions Luther, but nothing of the irony in a Jesuit thinker devoting a whopping book to a Lutheran emphasis.)

Godfrey paints on a very large canvas. Anyone interested in the concepts of trusting will find his book a resource. But I think that he has displayed the various dimensions of trusting that he proposes by fairly systematically underplaying the pervasive presence of propositional attitudes in the beliefs that are an essential component in trust. In a similar way he proposes distinct structural principles for different kinds of trusting when these differences are to be found in the very different motivations a person may have in engaging in trusting and continuing to trust. That said, in assembling a wide variety of data, discussing the views of many thinkers, and making his distinctive proposals, Godfrey has authored a work that cannot fail to be a resource for any one interested in trust.