Truth and Democracy

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Jeremy Elkins and Andrew Norris (eds.), Truth and Democracy, University of Pennsylvania Press, 2012, 352pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780812243796.

Reviewed by Christopher Robichaud, Harvard University


This collection of eighteen essays is intended, as the editors state in their introduction, "to reopen the question of truth and its place in political life to more sustained attention than it has in general received within the discipline of political theory" (3). To be clear, Elkins and Norris do not intend to reopen this issue just to show that it should have been left closed all along. They have put together a volume that embraces a concern for truth as an important part of politics and, by extension, of political theory. Living as we do at a time when truth and truthfulness have taken a holiday from the public arena, if they ever were around in the first place, renewing a focus on what ought to be the place of truth in democratic politics is most welcome. Truth and Democracy is a significant and rewarding contribution to this effort.

Elkins and Norris have collected a refreshingly broad range of papers from different disciplines -- among them history, political science, and philosophy -- and from different intellectual traditions within these disciplines. Contributions are arranged under four broad categories: Opinion and Agreement, Authority and Justification, Decision and Deliberation, and Truth and Public Reasons. Importantly, the papers do not exist alongside each other in a vacuum but instead are put into conversation, at least within each category, where two or three main essays are then followed by two or three cross-disciplinary responses. For instance, Martin Jay, a historian whose recent book, The Virtues of Mendacity, examines the role of lying in American politics, engages the arguments of Michael Lynch, a philosopher working within the analytic (or Anglo-American) tradition.

There is quite a bit to like in this volume. Rather than offering a cursory look at all of the essays in it, I will discuss at some length the two main essays in the final section of the collection, Truth and Public Reasons. The quality of argumentation in these chapters warrants careful consideration and is indicative of the quality of the essays overall.

In "Truth and Public Reason," Joshua Cohen argues that a political conception of truth ought to be incorporated into public reason, modeled after the Rawlsian idea of a political conception of justice, and distinguished from a theory of truth. Cohen understands this political conception of truth to be a set of propositions, including instances of the schema, "p" is true just in case p, as well as various additional propositions about truth, such as truth being the aim of belief, truth being a property that propositions (or assertions, beliefs, etc.) have when they represent things as they are, truth being distinct from warrant or justification, and truth being valuable (236-7). These propositions are to be counted among those available within public reason, and they can partly ground assertions within public reason such as "'Justice requires securing basic liberties for all' is true just in case justice requires securing basic liberties for all" or "Both our views are reasonable but mine has the advantage of being true". Cohen sees his political conception of truth as a minimal conception, in that it is not an analysis of truth. Minimal though it is, it is not, as he makes clear, a minimalist conception of truth, which is taken to be a kind of deflationism.

Why bring a political conception of truth into public reason? Rawls thought it should not be included.[1] But Cohen argues that an advocate of public reason ultimately can't escape doing so.

[T]he idea of locating a common ground of political reflection and argument that does without the concept of truth -- like doing without the concept of an object, or cause, or thought, or reason, or inference, or evidence -- is hard to grasp. Truth is so closely connected with intuitive notions of thinking, asserting, believing, judging, and reasoning that it is difficult to understand what leaving it behind amounts to. (226)

Inclusion of a political conception of truth in public reason is thus needed, according to Cohen, to make sense of much of what is going on in Rawlsian public deliberation. It is, by his lights, unavoidable. "[I]f political argument involves (as the idea of public reason indicates) beliefs, assertions, judgments, and reasoning, then truth also seems to be in play" (233).

I find this line of reasoning unpersuasive. Cohen slides quickly over the distinction between a concept and a conception.[2] Perhaps he thinks these amount to the same thing. But that would be surprising, given that he takes a conception to be a set of propositions, while concepts are commonly viewed as the sorts of thing -- mental representations, abilities, Fregean senses -- that constitute propositions but are distinct from them.[3] Availing oneself of this distinction allows one to meet the worries Cohen points to while remaining more thoroughly Rawlsian by not including a political conception of truth in public reason, at least in the way Cohen advocates.[4]

I want to briefly develop this point. It is of course correct that public deliberation of the sort Rawls envisioned involves making assertions, holding beliefs, forming judgments, advancing arguments, and so forth. And in order for any of us to have an understanding of these various activities, we are required to possess the concept of truth. So truth is indeed "in play" both in the sense that we must possess the concept of truth to understand these various activities, and, let us assume, even to engage in at least some of them.[5]Acknowledging all of this, though, doesn't require the crafting of some specific political conception of truth and then incorporating it into public reason proper.

Perhaps a political conception of truth might be needed if part of public reason involved reflecting on what it is that we're up to, at a rather abstract level -- making arguments, forming beliefs, etc. I see no basis, though, for public reason to include this sort of deliberation. We can perfectly well argue within public reason for a particular conception of justice, say, without also needing to explain, again within public reason, what it is that we're doing when we make arguments. And we can perfectly well make assertions about justice within public reason without needing to explain, again within public reason, what it is that we're doing when we make assertions. So we can embrace the idea that truth is a concept employed in the activities we engage in when we engage in public reason, while resisting the idea that a specific political conception of truth needs to be incorporated into public deliberation. In other words, we can comfortably employ the concept of truth in public deliberation without ever talking about truth in public deliberation. And it seems to me that only if we want to do the latter do we need a political conception of truth of the sort Cohen presents. There may be other reasons to embrace such a conception, and Cohen's essay touches on some of them (for instance, we may want to explain disagreements within public reason in terms of truth), but pace Cohen, we are not forced to incorporate such a conception into public reason on the basis of it being unavoidable, given the activities constituting public reason itself.

David Estlund also tackles the role of truth in public reason in his contribution, "The Truth in Political Liberalism". Unlike Cohen, he rejects the project of trying to carve out a political conception of truth; indeed, he rejects the entire project of deliberating publicly by way of political conceptions. One of his reasons for abandoning political conceptions involves their relationship to the truth.

[I]f the truth about justice is not necessarily a competent public reason, then political argument must not be addressed to the truth about justice as such, but to a political conception that can serve as justice for political purposes. This requires a distinction between true justice (justice in the true or best comprehensive conception) and political justice (justice on the most reasonable political conception). An awkward implication is that political justice might not be true justice. If it's not true justice, then it's not justice. (267)

Public deliberation about matters of justice, in other words, should be about justice, not about a political conception of justice that may have nothing to do with justice itself. I'm entirely sympathetic with this. So what's the alternative?

Estlund reminds us that "The fundamental tenet of political liberalism is about what counts as a successful justification, not about how to conduct ourselves in political argument." (269). As he sees it, this allows us to incorporate comprehensive doctrines -- including what we take truth to be -- into our public deliberation about political values and principles. The rub, though, is that at the end of the day, the process whereby we publicly deliberate upon these matters must be such that the verdict reached, whatever that ends up being, is one that can be justified to all participants involved in it. For Estlund, a promising feature of the process, one that would provide such a justification, were it present, is it being epistemically valuable. "If (in a familiar formula) free and vigorous debate under equal and favorable conditions would tend to lead toward the correct answer, then this is one strong reason for implementing such a discursive procedure" (271).

This might appear to be an unhelpful property to point to as a potential justifier of public reason. Our public deliberation is mired in persistent, pervasive and utterly rancorous debates over political principles and values, and this disagreement spills over into widespread recalcitrance in acknowledging even well-established scientific facts. It would seem, then, that public deliberation is anything but reliable in getting at the truth of things, and thus there is no reason along the epistemic lines imagined that is available to justify it.

Estlund does not address this concern in his paper for the volume, but he has elsewhere. In Democratic Authority, he argues for an "epistemically modest" assessment of public deliberation.[6] As I understand him, what Estlund means by that is the following. Take a series of catastrophic political outcomes: war, famine, economic collapse, and so forth. Presumably, on any reasonable theory of justice, political arrangements will count as just only if they do well in avoiding these outcomes. When making political decisions, we will deliberate publicly about a wide range of policy options and have disagreements about what justice demands. Suppose that our deliberation tends to result in policy decisions that avoid these catastrophes, where "tends" here means only that we do a better job after deliberating in avoiding these catastrophes than we would have done were we instead to have randomly decided what to do. If, then, public deliberation is reliable in this sense, then it is epistemically valuable, according to Estlund, and that value can be used to justify the decisions made to all participants in the deliberative process.

As attracted as I am to the framework Estlund is working within, the epistemic modesty he embraces is too modest to do the work he'd like it to do. We can imagine societies that believe all sorts of falsehoods across a wide range of topics, but that nevertheless deliberate in such a way that the political decisions reached succeed in avoiding certain catastrophes slightly better than if policies had been chosen randomly. In such cases, it would be odd to suggest that these deliberative practices had much epistemic value to them at all. They are riddled with error, and the bar is set rather low for what counts as success (anything better than randomly successful avoidance of catastrophic outcomes). Epistemic modesty seems to mean that any amount of epistemic value is value enough. That's unappealing.

I suggest that for public deliberation to have even the beginnings of the amount of epistemic value needed to do the work that Estlund wants it to do, it would need to produce policy decisions that are epistemically justified. We take epistemic justification to be quite epistemically valuable. Plausibly, a necessary condition on public deliberation being epistemically justified is that it is reliable. Its reliability will likely involve more, though, than merely reaching verdicts that do slightly better than random in avoiding the worst outcomes. Public deliberation being epistemically justified will also, plausibly, need to include an internalist condition. It will need to do this to avoid the kinds of objections that early reliabilist theories faced. For instance, many of us share the intuitive judgment that a person isn't justified in believing something that results from a process that she falsely but with good reason believes is unreliable. Just what this internalist condition would look like when it comes to public deliberation is something I cannot pursue here.

Space also prevents me from discussing many of the other important contributions to this collection. Some highlights for me included Jeremy Elkins's essay, "Concerning Practices of Truth", and Linda M. G. Zerilli's essay, "Truth and Politics", which both challenge, in different ways and for different reasons, the received view that finds Hannah Arendt resisting the admittance of truth-claims into the political arena. On the standard reading of her, facts -- as she sees them -- set the boundaries of political discussion but ought not make an appearance in those discussions.[7] Both Elkins and Zerilli persuasively argue that there is more subtlety to Arendt's position than that.

And Michael Lynch, in his essay, "Democracy as a Space of Reasons", provides an extremely clever political justification for the adoption of certain epistemic practices within public reason. He offers what he calls an argument from the epistemic original position. According to Lynch, if we were behind a veil of ignorance that would not allow us to take up any particular metaphysical picture of things nor allow us to assume anything about how reliable various epistemic practices were, we would nevertheless choose to adopt epistemic practices in the public arena that are repeatable, adaptable, public and widespread, as a matter of practical self-interest. This would open the door to providing a political justification for, among other things, public schools teaching only the theory of evolution in science classrooms.

Elkins and Norris see their volume not as offering the final word on the relationship between truth and democracy, but as opening up the conversation about this important matter for renewed academic investigation. By all counts, their book succeeds in this goal and provides many arguments that can profitably be engaged.

[1] “[W]ithin itself the political conception does without the concept of truth.” John Rawls. Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press, 2005). P. 94

[2] To be fair, so too might Rawls, per n.2.

[3] For a map of the terrain here, see

Margolis, Eric and Laurence, Stephen, "Concepts", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), and

McGrath, Matthew, "Propositions", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

[4] I myself am not attracted to the Rawlsian picture of public deliberation. The line of reasoning I offer here is meant for those who are attracted to it, like Cohen is, but who, unlike Cohen, remain uncomfortable incorporating a political conception of truth into it.

[5] We should be careful here. Beliefs aim at truth, but we don’t need a concept of truth to form beliefs. (Obviously more needs to be said here to spell this out, starting with what it means, exactly, for beliefs to aim at the truth, but I trust the claim is at least prima facie intelligible and plausible.) It does seem, though, that we need a concept of truth to engage in argumentation. So truth won’t be “in play” in the same way across the activities we’re looking at.

[6] Democratic Authority. (Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 2008). See especially Chapter 8, How Would Democracy Know?, pp. 159-83.

[7] Hannah Arendt. “Truth and Politics.” Between Past and Future (New York: Penguin Press, 1977.)