Truth and Justification

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Habermas, Jurgen, Truth and Justification, edited and with translations by Barbara Fulmer, MIT Press, 2003, 349pp, $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262083183.

Reviewed by Richard Rorty , Stanford University


The range of issues discussed in this collection of recent essays by Jürgen Habermas is suggested by the title of its Introduction: “Realism after the linguistic turn”. Habermas says that that turn shifted “the standard of epistemic objectivity from the private certainty of an experiencing subject to the public practice of justification within a communicative community”. It thereby encouraged a “contextualist challenge to the realist intuition”, for it raised the question of “whether any sense of context-independent validity can be salvaged from the concept of truth” (249).

Habermas formulates this challenge in the terms suggested by the title of one of the essays: “From Kant to Hegel and back again: the move toward detranscendentalization”. His expositions and criticisms of the work of Robert Brandom, Hilary Putman, and other contemporary philosophers are written with an eye to the Kant-Hegel contrast—the opposition between the universalism aimed at by transcendental philosophy and the particularism and localism necessitated by Hegelian historicism.

Habermas is one of the few philosophers who is as much at home with Hegel, Hamann and Heidegger as he is with Davidson, Sellars and Dummett. So he is able to move back and forth, smoothly and perspicuously, between small-scale critical analyses and insightful historical comparisons and generalizations. The result is a survey of the contemporary philosophical scene that is far more imaginative, and far more stimulating, than the sort found in books whose authors’ range of reference is limited to the last few decades’ worth of work within analytic philosophy.

This book will be of great interest both to students of Habermas’ universalistic discourse ethics and to philosophers interested in the debate between philosophers sympathetic to Wittgenstein and to pragmatism (such as Davidson, Putnam and Brandom) and their critics—especially those critics who, after conceding a great deal to Wittgenstein’s attack on empiricism, are still concerned to preserve what McDowell calls “answerability to the world”.

Habermas regards Brandom as representing “the state of the art of pragmatic approaches in analytic philosophy of language”, but thinks that Brandom’s “assimilation of the objectivity of experience to the intersubjectivity of communication is reminiscent of an infamous Hegelian move” (7-8). He reads Brandom as an arch-contextualist, whose inferentialist theory of the nature of propositional content “obliterates the distinction between the intersubjectively shared lifeworld and the objective world”. Brandom, he says, “does not rescue the realist intuitions by recourse to the contingent constraints of a world that is supposed to exist independently and for everyone” (155), and so is driven to a linguistified version of Hegel’s objective idealism.

Habermas argues that we need a concept of empirical truth that “connects the result of successful justification with something in the objective world” (42). This means keeping intact the distinction between the availability of a “justification-independent point of reference” for assertions of empirical fact and the absence of such a point of reference when we turn to moral judgments and norms. In morality, he says, we lack “the ontological connotation of reference to things about which we can state facts” (42). So he criticizes Brandom’s refusal to accept any version of the Kantian distinction between theoretical and practical uses of reason.

Habermas treats Putnam more sympathetically. He shares Putnam’s fear of relativism, and thinks that Putnam succeeds in offering a “theory of direct reference” that enables us to “recognize objects under different descriptions, or if, necessary, across paradigms” (219). But, although he thinks Putnam to be sounder than Brandom on the subject of empirical truth, he is dubious about the absence of what he calls “the moment of unconditionality” in Putnam’s account of moral norms. Putnam’s Deweyan and Aristotelian “virtue ethics”, he thinks, does not do justice to the distinction between “a universalist morality of justice and particularist ethics of the good life” (228).

Throughout this book, Habermas is concerned to keep distinctions in place that Hegelians and pragmatists urge us to dissolve. In particular, he sees the historicism common to Hegel, Heidegger and Dewey as endangering Kantian claims to the universal validity of, for example, the prohibition against torture. He is not willing to think of that prohibition as something local and recent—an innovation of the European Enlightenment. He insists that such absolute prohibitions are grounded in the nature of linguistic communication—in the ability of human beings to give and ask for reasons. He sees pragmatism’s assimilation of empirical truth to practical advantage as smoothing the way for moral relativism.

Like Putnam and the late Bernard Williams, Habermas wants to naturalize and de-transcendentalize philosophy, and to disconnect morality from metaphysics. So he is willing to concede a lot of ground to Nietzsche’s polemics against Plato—and in particular to give up on the correspondence theory of truth. But he nevertheless holds on both to claims of unconditionality and to what he calls “the natural Platonism of the lifeworld”—a Platonism that insists on “a justification-transcendent standard for orienting ourselves by context-independent truth-claims” (254).

The philosophers whom Habermas thinks have gone too far in an Hegelian direction agree with him that in the modern world “the moral universe loses the appearance of an ontological given and comes to be seen as a construct” (263). But they differ from him on two points: (1) whether to respond to this change by giving up the notion of “an ontological given” across the board--in empirical science as well as in morality; (2) whether, after recognizing the moral universe to be a construct, we need worry about whether it is a local construct or whether it contains elements that are more than merely local.

One’s reaction to Habermas’ new book will depend on whether one believes that retention of something like the “natural Platonism” of common sense is essential to our hopes for a decent society, or instead thinks that a change in common sense might help us realize these hopes. Those who follow Dewey in thinking of context-independence as a Platonist shibboleth will see Habermas as trying to nudge us back from Hegel to Kant at just the wrong moment—the moment when Hegelian ideas are beginning to revitalize analytic philosophy of mind and language. But if one thinks that Plato and Kant were on to something that Hegel was wrong to abandon--that playing the game of giving and asking for reasons requires both the notion of ontological givenness and that of unconditional obligation--then one will find this book very welcome indeed. Both sorts of readers will find the book as broad-gauged as it is incisive, and as forcefully argued as it is fair-minded.