Truth and Norms: Normative Alethic Pluralism and Evaluative Disagreements

Truth And Norms

Filippo Ferrari, Truth and Norms: Normative Alethic Pluralism and Evaluative Disagreements, Lexington Books, 2022, 191pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781793622679.

Reviewed by Chase Wrenn, The University of Alabama


In this book, Filippo Ferrari gives a new theory of truth’s normative import. He calls it “normative alethic pluralism” (NAP). According to NAP, truth does not have the same normative role in all discourses. Instead, different truth-norms can govern judgment in different subject areas. Ferrari makes his case by analyzing the phenomenon of disagreement in three different domains. On his analysis, disagreements about basic taste, refined aesthetics, and fundamental morality have different normative contours. Ferrari argues that their differences indicate that different sets of truth-norms are operative in each area.

Despite its name, NAP is not a version of alethic pluralism. The latter view claims that different substantive properties can “be” truth for different subject matters. Ferrari is critical of the most prominent forms of alethic pluralism. He instead adopts a “minimalist” view of truth. On it, the property of truth is fairly insubstantive, and it has no specific normative role built into it. Ferrari argues that NAP fits with his minimalism better than with alethic pluralism.

After sketching the book’s main line of argument, I’ll comment on some of its strengths and weaknesses.

Chapter 1 presents Ferrari’s minimalist view of truth. It includes a theory of TRUE, the concept, a theory of truth, the property, and a theory of truth-aptness. The view has some features in common with both contemporary alethic pluralism and some varieties of deflationism.

Like many alethic pluralists, Ferrari defines TRUE by way of its theoretical role as part of a network of concepts, including BELIEF, INQUIRY, ASSERTION, and JUSTIFICATION. Also like many pluralists (Wright 1992; Lynch 2009; Edwards 2018), he appeals to some a priori platitudes to characterize that role. They include such claims as “Truth is the goal of inquiry” and “A proposition may be justified without being true, and may be true without being justified.” Ferrari leaves the door open to expanding the list he gives, which he takes to be minimally sufficient to pick out TRUE’s theoretical role. He thus differs from deflationists who identify TRUE as a merely logical device for disquotation, generalization, indirect assertion, etc.

However, like many deflationists, Ferrari advocates a very thin account of the property, truth. It is just the property of falling under the concept TRUE, or of being under the extension of “is true.” So characterized, truth is fairly trivial and insubstantial. It’s not the kind of property whose nature would explain very much. Ferrari doesn’t deny that truth could be metaphysically richer, but his aim in the book is to assume as little about truth as is necessary to make his case. This aspect of his minimalism resembles some kinds of methodological deflationism (Wrenn 2015).

Ferrari’s account of truth-aptness is similarly minimal. To be truth-apt, a sentence needs to meet only two requirements. First, its use must be disciplined by rules of correct and incorrect application. Second, its syntax must allow its embedding in negation and the conditional. Again, Ferrari does not deny that some sentences are truth-apt in a richer way, but that possibility plays no role in his arguments.

In Chapter 2, Ferrari argues that certain evaluative judgments are truth-apt. They have the right syntax, and their usage is governed by the right kind of rules.

But where there is truth and falsehood, there can be disagreement in judgment. Ferrari outlines his theoretical framework for understanding disagreement in Chapter 3. Disagreement, in the sense relevant to his project, is “doxastic non-cotenability.” Two judgments are doxastically non-cotenable when making either of them commits one to not making the other (MacFarlane 2014). In Ferrari’s minimalist framework, any judgments that are contrary or contradictory to each other turn out to be doxastically non-cotenable. So, disagreement occurs whenever people make contrary or contradictory judgments.

Chapter 3 also introduces several “marks of normative significance” that can be present in disagreements. Two are especially important to his case for NAP: alethic faultlessness and parity.

Ferrari illustrates alethic fault with an example (66). Suppose Marie and Jane disagree about whether Mattia is on a flight, but each of their judgments is epistemically justified. Only one of their opinions is true. Even though they are epistemically on par, the one with the true belief seems better off than the one with the false belief. The true belief is “alethically proper,” while the false one is “alethically faulty.” A disagreement is alethically faultless if neither party’s judgment is alethically faulty.

Parity is a special case of faultlessness. A disagreement exhibits parity when the parties can recognize its faultlessness, even from within their committed perspectives.

There is a puzzle embedded in these remarks. On the one hand, some disagreements do seem faultless. For example, suppose Yuk and Yum have both tasted a plate of oysters under normal circumstances. Yum judges them delicious, and Yuk judges them not delicious. They disagree, but we have no inclination to find fault with the judgment of either. Their disagreement even exhibits parity. Yuk can recognize that there is no fault in Yum’s judgment, without agreeing that the oysters are delicious. On the other hand, each must see the other’s judgment as false. But how could a judgment be false without being alethically faulty?

In Chapter 4, Ferrari analyzes disagreements in basic taste, refined aesthetics, and fundamental morality. He finds that we take disagreements about basic taste to be superficial and generally faultless. We take disagreements in refined aesthetics to be somewhat faultless, and we take moral disagreements not to be faultless at all.

NAP, Ferrari thinks, can make sense of that pattern, as well as the possibility of faultlessness and parity in disagreement. It claims there are multiple truth-norms, and not every discourse is subject to them all. Alethic faults are relative to specific norms, but some norms don’t apply in some discourses. So, mere falsehood isn’t enough for a judgment to be faulty relative to a given truth-norm. The judgment’s subject matter must also be governed by that norm.

Ferrari discusses four truth-norms in Chapter 5, representing four dimensions of normativity. They are:

DEONTIC                  One ought to judge that p (if and) only if <p> is true.

AXIOLOGICAL        It is valuable (good) to judge that p (if and) only if <p> is true.

TELEOLOGICAL      Judgment aims at truth.

CRITERIAL               It is correct (fitting) to judge that p (if and) only if <p> is true.

Trivially, TELEOLOGICAL applies to all discourses, because an attitude that doesn’t aim at truth doesn’t qualify as “judgment.” Ferrari does not claim CRITERIAL applies in all discourses, but it’s not hard to see why it might. To be truth-apt, a sentence has to be governed by rules of correct application. If those rules specify that a judgment isn’t correct unless it’s true, CRITERIAL applies. But correctness here is a very thin notion, applying to setting the table or singing a tune correctly no less than to making a true judgment.

DEONTIC and AXIOLOGICAL are where the action is. Ferrari thinks we can detect their applicability to a discourse by looking at our reactions to disagreement. Deontic and axiological fault are not the same. The former applies when someone has done what she ought not to have done. The latter applies when someone does something disvaluable, bad, or at least not good. Forbiddenness and badness, however, are different dimensions of normativity. If two people disagree, at least one of their judgments is false. We can ask whether their false judgment is forbidden, bad, both, or neither. Our answers tell us whether DEONTIC, AXIOLOGICAL, both, or neither is in force in the judgment’s domain.

Ferrari thinks disagreements about judgments of basic taste can be both deontically and axiologically faultless. When Yum judges the oysters delicious, and Yuk disagrees, neither is judging in a way that is disvaluable or forbidden. So, neither DEONTIC nor AXIOLOGICAL applies in that domain.

Disagreements about fundamental morality are at the other extreme. When someone makes a false moral judgment, we react to them as if their doing so is more than just disvaluable. They ought not to have made that judgment. So, DEONTIC and AXIOLOGICAL do govern that domain of discourse.

Refined aesthetics lies between the extremes of taste and morality. Suppose Yuk and Yum disagree about which of Gould’s renditions of the Goldberg Variations is best. Yuk and Yum are both competent and sophisticated critics, and each has listened carefully to the recordings. Neither violates any obligations in judging. So, DEONTIC seems not to apply. But we can make sense of better and worse judgment here. In having her opinion, each critic is committed to the superiority of her own evaluation. The other’s opinion isn’t forbidden, but it isn’t good either. So, AXIOLOGICAL does seem to apply.

Ferrari’s main case for NAP takes the following shape. We consider deontic and axiological fault to be appropriately attributable to false judgments in some, but not all, areas of discourse. So, DEONTIC and AXIOLOGICAL apply in only some, not all, discourses. But if truth-apt discourses can feature different truth-norms, then truth’s normative role can vary from discourse to discourse. NAP follows.

In the last two chapters, Ferrari considers the relationship between NAP and the nature of truth. He addresses alethic pluralism in Chapter 6. According to alethic pluralism, different discourses can feature different truth-properties. Might the truth’s normative variability arise because truth itself is not always the same property?

Ferrari is skeptical. He argues that existing versions of alethic pluralism conflict with NAP. They incorporate the “strict requirement” that “any admissible truth property must satisfy the theoretical role as defined by all the core features [of TRUE] with no exceptions” (126). Moreover, the most prominent versions of pluralism include DEONTIC, AXIOLOGICAL, or both on the list of core features. Those theories can’t allow for NAP without either abandoning the strict requirement or changing their account of TRUE’s core features.

Rather than revising alethic pluralism, Ferrari advocates a minimalist approach in Chapter 7. His minimalism allows for truth’s normative significance, but it doesn’t prescribe any particular norms as definitive of TRUE. Ferrari defends “extrinsicism” about truth’s normative import. According to that view, truth-norms are not operative in virtue of truth’s own nature. Rather, they arise as features of discourses in which we make truth-apt judgments. Truth’s normative role is, in that sense, “extrinsic” to it.

My summary does not do justice to all the details and nuances of Ferrari’s case for NAP. Ferrari’s book is an outstanding contribution to several ongoing debates. They include debates on the nature of disagreement, normativity, and, of course, the nature of truth. It is required reading for philosophers working on truth, and its insights on disagreement and normativity are valuable. Three of the book’s strengths especially stand out.

First, it brings discipline to some previously undisciplined debates. Philosophers have been quick to talk about “the normativity of truth” and “the value of truth,” as if we all meant the same thing and knew what we meant. But we don’t, and Ferrari’s careful distinctions among the dimensions of normativity provide much-needed clarity.

Second, Ferrari’s brand of alethic minimalism is a model for how philosophers can focus on key features of truth without taking on unnecessary theoretical baggage. At least until Chapter 7, he focuses on fairly uncontroversial features of truth, but he avoids bold, deflationary claims that they exhaust what truth might be.

Third, the methodological focus on disagreement is original and ingenious. In cases of disagreement, we can be sure someone’s opinion is false. To figure out what we think is wrong with false judgment, it makes sense to consider our reactions to disagreement. They can tell us something about the rules we take those who disagree with us to be breaking.

Still, no book is perfect, and Ferrari’s has some weaknesses. They are mostly minor, but I’ll mention three.

First, and most minor, “normative alethic pluralism” is poorly named. It is not a version of alethic pluralism. So, it would be helpful for it to have a different name.

Second, Chapter 6’s critique of alethic pluralism overstresses the “strict requirement.” As he depicts them, alethic pluralists such as Michael Lynch think there is a fixed list of principles that define truth’s theoretical role, and the truth-property in every discourse has to satisfy them all. But that isn’t Lynch’s view. In Truth as One and Many, Lynch identifies some “core truisms” about truth, but he also claims that a discourse’s truth-property is whatever property best satisfies them. Lynch leaves room for the possibility that what best satisfies the truisms doesn’t satisfy them all.

Third, there is a weakness in Ferrari’s main line of argument for NAP. As he construes it, DEONTIC applies to a discourse only if we deem it appropriate to assign deontic fault to false judgments in that area. Likewise, AXIOLOGICAL applies only if we deem appraisals of axiological fault appropriate. These tests, however, may lead to false negatives.

Consider the arena of basic taste. Suppose Yuk samples the oysters in ordinary circumstances, and she has a certain (yucky) taste experience. What if she judges that they are delicious, despite how they taste? Arguably, Yuk would be judging as she ought not, for our judgments of deliciousness ought to line up with our taste experiences. Such a judgment would be disvaluable as well; our judgments of deliciousness are better or worse as a function of how well they track our taste experiences.

Of course, it wouldn’t be appropriate for anyone to blame Yuk or to attribute fault to her. No one can appropriately fault Yuk’s judgment unless they know it does not align with her taste experience. But the only person who knows the exact nature of Yuk’s experience is Yuk herself, and she says it’s delicious. When no one can have standing to fault Yuk and Yum’s judgments, their disagreement will seem faultless by Ferrari’s test—even if DEONTIC and AXIOLOGICAL are in force.


Edwards, Douglas. 2018. The Metaphysics of Truth. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Ferrari, Filippo. 2022. Truth and Norms: Normative Alethic Pluralism and Evaluative Disagreements. Lexington Books.

Lynch, Michael P. 2009. Truth as One and Many. New York: Oxford University Press.

MacFarlane, John. 2014. Assessment Sensitivity: Relative Truth and Its Applications. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wrenn, Chase B. 2015. Truth. Cambridge, UK, and Malden, MA: Polity Press.

Wright, Crispin. 1992. Truth and Objectivity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.