Truth and Paradox: Solving the Riddles

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Maudlin, Tim, Truth and Paradox: Solving the Riddles, Oxford, 2004, 209pp, $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199247293

Reviewed by Byeong D. Lee, University of Seoul


There is an enormous literature on the Liar paradox, because it is one of the oldest paradoxes in philosophy. Why then another book on this paradox? Maudlin’s Truth and Paradox offers a new way out of this paradox, which is worth exploring. In this short review, I cannot do justice to many of his thought-provoking points: for example, his discussions about Kripke’s theory of truth, logical truth, and Gödel’s Incompleteness Theorems are very illuminating. Instead, I shall briefly introduce his proposal in a rather informal way, and then discuss some problematic aspects of it.

To begin with, let us consider how a version of the Liar paradox arises. Consider a simple language that contains terms for atomic propositions, the classical connectives, singular terms, and a truth predicate ‘T(x)’. Let the singular term ‘ λ’ denote the sentence ‘ ~T(λ)’. Then λ says of itself that it is not true. According to our conception of truth, we can infer ‘P is true’ from ‘P’; conversely ‘P’ from ‘P is true’. Maudlin calls the first rule an Upward T-Inference and the latter a Downward T-Inference. Now we can easily derive a contradiction as follows. Suppose for reductio that T(λ). Then we can infer by the Downward T-Inference that ~T(λ). Then it follows by reductio that ~T(λ). Finally by the Upward T-Inference we can get ‘T(λ)’. Contradiction. What went wrong?

According to Maudlin, the above sort of semantic paradoxes can be resolved by the following fundamental postulate: “truth and falsity are always ultimately rooted in the state of the world” (p. 49); thus any sentence which is not grounded in the state of the world lacks a classical truth value. What then is wrong with the Liar sentence? To determine the truth value of the Liar sentence ‘ ~T(λ)’, we need to determine the truth value of its immediate semantic constituent ‘T(λ)’; and to determine the truth value of ‘T(λ)’, we need to determine the truth value of the sentence λ denotes. Since ‘ ~T(λ)’ is what λ denotes, we go back to the sentence we originally started with. In other words, a backward path from the Liar sentence never reaches what Maudlin calls ‘a boundary sentence’. The truth value of a boundary sentence, which has no immediate semantic constituent, is determined not by the truth values of other sentences, but by the world. Since the Liar sentence is not grounded, Maudlin claims that it is neither true nor false.

Since the Liar sentence is neither true nor false, it is certainly not true. From this we can infer by the Upward T-Inference that T(‘ ~T(λ)’). And since λ = ‘ ~T(λ)’, it follows that T(λ). In other words, the sequence

~ (T(λ) ∨ Φ(λ)) → ~T(λ) → T(‘ ~T(λ)’) → T(λ)

is a sequence of valid inferences. Here ‘ Φ(n)’ means that the sentence denoted by n is false. Do these inferences show by reductio that ‘T(λ) ∨ Φ(λ)’ is true after all? Note that if a contradiction is derived from a hypothesis using valid rules then, in a classical setting, the negation of the hypothesis is true. According to Maudlin, however, the validity of these inferences simply guarantees that they are truth-preserving; thus in a semantics which admits a third value ungrounded, such as his theory, this justification fails. In other words, if a hypothesis does not have a classical truth-value, we cannot say that the conclusion derived from it is true. Since the initial sentence in the above sequence of inferences is not true, all that follow it are ungrounded. In addition, according to Maudlin, criteria for asserting ungrounded sentences are intuitively as follows. We are not permitted to assert of an ungrounded sentence that it is true, nor that it is false. For it is neither true nor false. But we are permitted to assert that it is not true. Therefore, the initial sentence ‘ ~ (T(λ) ∨Φ(λ))’ and the one that follows it ‘ ~T(λ)’ are permissible, but the last two ‘T(‘ ~T(λ)’)’ and ‘T(λ)’ are not permissible. Hence we can avoid asserting both ‘ ~T(λ)’ and ‘T(λ)’. This is Maudlin’s basic idea for his way out.

On Maudlin’s view, “if a sentence is either true or false, then either it is a boundary sentence, made true or false by the world of non-semantic facts, or it is semantically connected to at least one boundary sentence, from which its truth value can be traced” (p. 49). Thus we are not permitted to say that ‘the Liar sentence is ungrounded’ is true. For it too is ungrounded. Nonetheless, we are still permitted to assert that the Liar is not grounded, because it is indeed the case that the Liar sentence is not grounded. Maudlin admits that this result seems to “fly in the face of truisms about truth” (p. 51). He claims, however, that this aspect of his theory isn’t ad hoc, but rather a direct consequence of his fundamental postulate mentioned above. His governing intuition is this: “Classical truth values cannot simply be conjured out of thin air: they must originate always at the boundary of a language, where the language meets the world” (p. 51).

One important consequence of this view is that asserting a sentence is quite a different thing from asserting that it is true. This directly conflicts with a platitudinous view that there is a conceptual connection between assertion and truth, namely that asserting a sentence is claiming that it is true. This platitudinous view might also be put this way. In asserting (or believing) a claim, one not only commits oneself to it-in the sense that one will use it as a premise in one’s reasonings-but one also undertakes a responsibility to show that one is entitled to the commitments expressed by one’s assertion of it. Thus it is difficult to distinguish asserting a claim from endorsing that it is true. Therefore a question naturally arises. Is it really that Maudlin’s fundamental postulate is intuitively so plausible that it forces us to give up the above platitudinous view? I very much doubt it. Maudlin seems committed to a sort of semantic reductionism, according to which every truth must be rooted in nonsemantic facts. But this is very controversial. I grant that there is no non-semantic fact which makes the Liar sentence true or false. But there could still be a fact about the graph-theoretical structure of the Liar sentence which makes ‘the Liar sentence is not grounded’ true. Besides, Maudlin’s fundamental postulate implies many unintuitive consequences. For one thing, we cannot assert that logical laws are true. Note that the sentence ‘all true sentences are true’, for instance, is not true because it is not grounded. For another thing, on Maudlin’s theory, sometimes it is appropriate to assert and believe even self-contradictory sentences. Suppose one uses a system of inferential rules, say Σ, which one regards as truth-preserving. Now consider the following two sentences:

χ: ∀x∀y((DerΣ (x, y) & T(x)) ⊃ T(y)).
ξ: ~ DerΣ (χ, ξ)

Here the predicate ‘DerΣ (x, y)’ denotes the relation that holds just in case the sentence denoted by y can be derived from the sentence denoted by x in accordance with the inference rules in Σ. Then the sentence χ says that the rules in Σ are truth-preserving, and the sentence ξ says of itself that it cannot be derived from χ using rules in Σ. Maudlin shows that we can derive a contradiction from χ using ξ. Since we intuitively take χ to express something true, he claims that it is appropriate to assert χ, even though it is self-contradictory. He insists that this sort of counterintuitive result is “a reasonable price to pay for clarity and consistency in semantics” (p. 105). But it seems to me that a more reasonable conclusion should be just the opposite, namely that Maudlin’s fundamental postulate is not that plausible after all.

The worst still remains. Maudlin’s theory cannot handle the strengthened version of the Liar paradox. He introduces the predicates ‘is permissible’ and ‘is impermissible’ in the metalanguage, and these predicates can be used to produce the so-called permissibility paradox. Let us define ω as follows:

ω: ~PΣi (ω)

The sentence ω says of itself that it is not permissible in accordance with the rules in Σi. Is then ω permissible to assert or not? If ‘ ~PΣi (ω)’ is permitted, then one is permitted to assert a falsehood. If, on the other hand, it is forbidden, then one is forbidden to assert a truth. Either way, we end up violating some desideratum which the concept of permissibility is supposed to satisfy. Maudlin admits that we cannot avoid this problem; nonetheless he says: “defeat is not dishonor when it is logically unavoidable. At least we now understand what the defeat is, and why it cannot be avoided” (p. 192.).

Is defeat really inevitable? Is modifying classical logic the only way to avoid the Liar paradox? The answers to both questions seem to be negative. For example, Gupta and Belnap’s revision theory of truth not only shows how to handle the Liar paradox within classical logic, but it also seems to have fewer serious problems with regard to the Strengthened Liar (see their The Revision Theory of Truth, The MIT Press, 1993.) Curiously, though, Maudlin neglects a proper discussion of their theory. According to Gupta and Belnap, the Liar paradox is simply an instance of the more general phenomenon of pathological cases generated by circular definitions. Following Tarski, they take Tarski biconditionals as partial definitions of truth. They also read the ‘if and only if’ in those biconditionals, not as material equivalence, but as definitional equivalence. Now consider the Liar sentence again:

λ is true =df ~T(λ).

This can be taken as a partial definition of truth, which explains wherein the truth of λ consists. Given this circular definition, there is no definite way of determining whether λ is true. Gupta and Belnap show, however, that there is a way of making sense of circular definitions like this. Their idea is as follows. If a definition is circular, we cannot determine the extension of the definiendum definitely. But we can determine what the extension should be by evaluating the extension hypothetically. That is, we start with an arbitrary extension of the given circular term as a hypothesis. By using this extension, we determine the extension of the definiens. This provides a new extension of the definiendum for the next stage. And by using this new extension, we again determine the extension of the definiens. We repeat this process ad infinitum, yielding what they call a revision sequence. The Liar sentence shows a pathological behavior in that if λ is in the extension of the truth predicate at a revision stage α, then it is outside its extension at α + 1, but it is back inside its extension at α + 2, and so on. Nonetheless, λ does not generate a contradiction; for λ is true at a certain stage, and its negation is true at a different stage. Thus we don’t need to give up classical logic. Gupta and Belnap also show that we can handle the Strengthened Liar in a similar way.

Maudlin does an excellent job in explaining why other theories of truth, such as Tarski’s and Kripke’s, are unsatisfying and also why he is driven to his own theory. But, as Gupta and Belnap (1993, p. 261) insist, it seems that “the theory of truth should not disturb the logic of the ground language.” In other words, if the logic of the ground language is classical, it seems that simply adding the truth predicate to this language should not force us to give up classical logic. Besides, Maudlin’s theory has many other counterintuitive consequences mentioned before. Therefore Maudlin’s book has made me more attracted to Gupta and Belnap’s view that the Liar paradox is simply an instance of the more general phenomena of pathological cases generated by circular definitions.