Truth and Pluralism: Current Debates

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Nikolaj J. L. L. Pedersen and Cory D. Wright (eds.), Truth and Pluralism: Current Debates, Oxford University Press, 2013, 353pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195387469.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, Uppsala University


Truth pluralism as it has mostly been discussed in the literature is the idea that truth consists of different things in different regions of discourse. For example, sometimes but not always it amounts to correspondence. This idea might at least at first sound decidedly unattractive. Of course, in some sense the truth of the claim that 2+2=4 consists of something different from the truth of the claim that roses are red, but that's just a matter of 2+2's being 4 being different from roses' being red. Truth doesn't come into it. Compare existence and identity. Pluralism about existence and pluralism about identity sound at first like equally obvious non-starters. Perhaps the existence of numbers is different from the existence of roses. But that's just a matter of numbers and roses being different; existence itself need not be held to have a nature that manifests in different ways in different cases. Similar remarks arguably apply to identity pluralism.

But truth pluralism has gotten a lot of positive attention since Crispin Wright (1992), where the idea was introduced into the contemporary literature. Michael Lynch (2009) provides a prominent book-length defense of the view. And separately, pluralism about existence, "ontological pluralism", has been developed by Kris McDaniel (e.g., 2009) and Jason Turner (2010). Given that one may expect some concerns in both cases to be parallel, it is actually striking that ontological pluralism gets no mention at all in the present volume. However, readers interested in the connection between truth pluralism and ontological pluralism can consult later works by some of the authors involved: Nikolaj Pedersen's (2014), and Aaron Cotnoir and Douglas Edwards' (forthcoming).

Most of the contributions to the present volume concern pluralism as described, Wright-Lynch pluralism as I will call it henceforth. The contributions by Lynch and Crispin Wright themselves, Marian David, Pedersen and Cory Wright, and Edwards concern how best to construe Wright-Lynch pluralism. The contributions by Pascal Engel and Julian Dodd are critical of the view. Some contributions focus on slightly different kinds of pluralism. Gila Sher as well as Robert Barnard and Terence Horgan defend a different kind of pluralist view: truth is always correspondence with reality, but correspondence in turn comes in many forms. Further, JC Beall and Max Kölbel both defend the view that truth is pluralist in the sense that whereas some truth predicates are deflationary, others are not fully deflationary. Richard Fumerton defends a correspondence theory and does not explicitly engage with Wright-Lynch pluralism, but his criticisms of alternatives to the correspondence theory apply, mutatis mutandis, to this pluralism as well. Cotnoir discusses the semantic paradoxes, and argues that pluralism of roughly the Wright-Lynch variety provides a new, promising take on them. I return to Cotnoir below. Dorothy Grover discusses another kind of pluralism: the view that there is no complete description of the world but instead "our different descriptions provide a necessary variety of perspectives on the world" (p. 239). Simon Blackburn primarily discusses the supposed problem that deflationists about truth have accommodating the principle that to assert is to present as true.

This volume presents the state of the art when it comes to truth pluralism. In addition, it also contains contributions to other debates relating to truth, for example concerning deflationist and correspondence theories of truth, and concerning truth as a norm of assertion and belief. The contributions vary somewhat in quality and rigor, but not more than is to be expected in an edited volume; and there are enough high-quality contributions to make this an overall good collection.

Strikingly, given the focus on Wright-Lynch pluralism, no contribution seeks to mount a positive defense of the view; insofar as motivations for the view are brought up they are either briefly summarized or brought up for criticism. Those contributions that are concerned in some way with defending Wright-Lynch pluralism, those by Lynch, Crispin Wright, Pedersen and Cory Wright, and Edwards, discuss either what is the most defensible version of this kind of view, or how to respond to problems for such a view.

Positive arguments for the view have of course been presented elsewhere. But it would have been nice to see the case for it further developed, especially since it is not obviously impressive. A main argument that Lynch (2009) gives for his pluralist view is that truth sometimes is correspondence but cannot always be. The argument that truth cannot always be correspondence is -- as already Nicholas Smith (2010) notes in a review of Lynch's book -- essentially an argument that a simple causal theory of reference cannot work across the board. The argument is compelling only if a correspondence theory is beholden to such a theory of reference. But a correspondence theorist may well say that a causal theory of reference is relevant only for determining which propositions sentences express; and a correspondence theory is a theory about something else, namely, what makes a true proposition true.

Wright's main argument for pluralism has had to do with the main theme of his (1992): that there are different "marks" of realism, and different discourses may conform to different subsets of these marks. In (1992), Wright spoke of this as involving different notions of truth being operative for these different discourses. But he didn't elaborate much, and it is easy to get the impression that pluralism about truth was an optional extra: if one preferred to, one could buy into Wright's idea of different marks of realism for different discourses without buying into pluralism about truth. (However, one main problem for pluralism about truth, that of how to deal with so-called mixed statements, is a problem for Wright's ideas even when these are divorced from pluralism about truth.)

Even though no contribution is advertised as positively making a case for Wright-Lynch pluralism, some may be seen as purporting to do so. First, Edwards and Crispin Wright both centrally discuss an analogy between making a true assertion and winning a game. Even while their contributions are not presented as outright arguments for Wright-Lynch pluralism, the analogy is evocative enough that it can provide motivation. Some sort of pluralism seems correct about winning a game: winning in chess consists in something different from winning in gymnastics or solitaire. So if truth is suitably analogous, some sort of pluralism is correct about truth. But even if this establishes that in some sense truth consists in different things in different cases, it does not by itself come near establishing the truly distinctive claim characteristic of Wright-Lynch pluralism: that different ones among the theories of truth traditionally discussed in the philosophical literature -- the correspondence theory, the epistemic theory, the coherence theory, etc. -- might describe truth for different discourses.

Second, Cotnoir suggests that a certain kind of pluralist has a special way out of the liar paradox. Take a liar sentence L, saying of itself that it is "not true". Cotnoir says that the pluralist about truth -- the "strong" pluralist who says not only that are there different truth properties, but also that there is no general concept of truth at all -- can get around the liar paradox by saying that the truth concept expressed in the sentence itself is different from the truth concept appropriate to it. He says, "As strong pluralists, we are free to claim that λ1 is not true1. Of course, λ1 actually says of itself that it is not true1. And so intuitively, it ought to be true! But if λ1 is actually in domain2, it may very well be true2. We can endorse T2λ1˺) without paradox" (p. 342). Much of Cotnoir's discussion is then devoted to the question of whether a universal truth predicate can be characterized after all, and paradox thus reinstated. Cotnoir's solution is to reject the notion of infinite disjunctions.

What Cotnoir suggests is interesting, and if the Wright-Lynch pluralist has a distinctive and attractive way out of the liar paradox, then that certainly provides motivation for the pluralist view. But the truth property expressed by the predicate employed in the liar sentence and the truth concept in terms of which the liar sentence is properly evaluated are both truth properties for semantic discourse, and what Wright-Lynch pluralism is about is that there are different truth properties for different discourses. Cotnoir's way out of the liar paradox demands much finer distinctions. Even if what he suggests is workable and requires something deserving of the label pluralism, it is rather removed from Wright-Lynch pluralism.

Let me now turn to a different issue: the distinction between concepts and properties. This distinction seems crucial in many discussions about truth. Frege's famous regress argument from "The Thought" arguably at best shows that the concept of truth cannot be analyzed (in terms of correspondence or anything else), but that leaves open that the property of being true can be the property of, say, corresponding with reality. Compare here a well-known response to Moore's open question argument. Generally, the correspondence theory itself can either be taken as an analysis of the concept of truth, or (merely) as an account of the property of being true. The concept/property distinction is also relevant when it comes to understanding deflationism. On many characterizations of deflationism, all that is said is that truth is somehow defined by (the instances of) the T-schema. But is that meant to be a characterization of the concept of being true or of the property of being true? If only the former, then the deflationism thus characterized is compatible with a correspondence theory of the property of being true.

The distinction between concepts and properties also looms large when it comes to the question of Wright-Lynch pluralism, and many of the contributors explicitly discuss that theme. Some versions of Wright-Lynch pluralism say that while there is one truth concept, there are many different truth properties. Other versions say that there are different truth concepts. The different versions of pluralism have different strengths and weaknesses. Papers where the question of how best to conceive of Wright-Lynch pluralism is a central theme include those by Lynch and Crispin Wright, and that by the editors, Pedersen and Cory Wright.

But given how central the concept/property distinction is and has been to the discussion of Wright-Lynch pluralism, it is disappointing to see several contributors who discuss this issue apparently being sloppy when it comes to this distinction. Lynch, after having discussed at some length the idea that the concept of truth is a functional concept, in the sense that the concept ascribes whatever property satisfies the "truth role", rather surreptitiously slides in the idea that the property of being true is a functional property. There are other, related problems in Lynch's discussion. He speaks of conceptually essential features of properties. But when one speaks of what is conceptually essential as opposed to what is metaphysically essential, this seems a mistake. Compare: even if the property of being water = the property of being H2O, it seems natural to say (if one uses the notion of being conceptually essential at all) that while it is conceptually essential that H2O contains hydrogen it is not conceptually essential that water contains hydrogen -- but what is then conceptually essential to the property in question? Dodd says that traditional monistic theories of truth seek to identify a property F that truth (everywhere) consists in and says about this property, "the property F . . . must be conceptually more fundamental than the concept of truth itself" (p. 299). One might have thought that what stands in the relation conceptually more fundamental than would have to always be concepts rather than properties. To repair Dodd's formulation one would have to add something along the lines of "Some concept of . . . ".

Despite speaking of the property of being true as a functional property, Lynch rejects the conceptions of this property that comparisons with functionalism would suggest, that truth is a realizer property or a role property. Instead he introduces a notion of immanence, where an immanent property "is a property that can be manifested by other properties" and a property M "manifests an immanent property F just when it is a priori that F's conceptually essential features are a subset of M's features" (p. 31). Applied to the property of being true, the idea is that for some propositions, their truth is immanent in their correspondence to various bits of reality, but for others truth is not immanent in correspondence.

The terminology of immanence is evocative. But compare the case of identity (which Lynch also mentions, p. 38). Compare the identity relation with the various relations being the same F as, where "F" is a substance sortal. By the same reasoning that Lynch employs in the case of truth, it is rather straightforward that identity is immanent in these various relations. If truth's immanence in various other properties is sufficient for the relevant sort of pluralism, we then get analogous identity pluralism on the cheap. Generally, it is rather easy for a property or relation to be immanent in various other relations. Consider every case where we have a property of being F and various properties of being Φ-ly F. The property of being F will be immanent in the latter properties. The conclusion is that the mere fact that truth is immanent in various other properties would not distinguish the property of being true as an interestingly "functional" property.

I have devoted most of the review to Wright-Lynch pluralism. Let me now turn briefly to the kind of pluralism espoused by Sher and also by Horgan and Barnard, according to which truth is correspondence, but there are different kinds of correspondence. The one application that Sher spends the most time on in her contribution is mathematics. She argues that truth for arithmetical sentences consists in indirect correspondence. Our underlying concern when using arithmetic is with certain formal features of reality; our use of singular terms and first-order quantification simply depends on this being convenient for us given the sorts of minds we have. Even while what directly corresponds to a sentence of the form "m+n=k" would be a state of affairs involving such individuals as numbers, this sentence indirectly corresponds to a state of affairs more directly represented using higher-order quantification. Sher says that the truth condition of "four is even" is "two-layered".

 'Four is even' is true


The individual four has the first-level property of being even,


The second-level property of holding of exactly four individuals has the third-level property of being even. (p. 173)

One question about this is: if these biconditionals accurately represent the truth conditions, does not Sher in the end then believe that the individual four has the property of being even? And if so, is there not then something for "four is even" to directly correspond to? Second, there already is on offer an account in the literature with the virtues of Sher's account (and without the problem just noted). A certain kind of fictionalist can say that while "four is even" semantically expresses something which is false if there are no such individuals as numbers, ordinary use of it pragmatically communicates something else, perhaps the sort of thing Sher is talking about when saying what true arithmetical sentences correspond to. This fictionalist does not traffic in different sorts of correspondence truth; she only posits different contents, communicated in different ways by the use of the sentence. She can in principle adopt Sher's motivation for the indirect correspondence view: our interest is in formal features of reality, and that our mathematical language has the features it has is explained by what sorts of minds we have. Sher notes that there are differences between her view and such a fictionalist view, but she does say what is supposed to make her view preferable.


Cotnoir, Aaron and Douglas Edwards: forthcoming, "From Truth Pluralism to Ontological Pluralism and Back Again".

Lynch, Michael: 2009, Truth as One and Many, Clarendon Press, Oxford.

McDaniel, Kris: 2009, "Ways of Being", in David Chalmers, David Manley and Ryan Wasserman (eds.), Metametaphysics, Clarendon Press, Oxford, pp. 290-319.

Pedersen, Nikolaj: 2014, "Pluralism x 3: Truth, Logic, Metaphysics", Erkenntnis 79: 259-77.

Smith, N. J. J.: 2010, "Review of Michael Lynch Truth as One and Many", Analysis 70: 191-93.

Turner, Jason: "Ontological Pluralism", Journal of Philosophy 107: 5-34.

Wright, Crispin: 1992, Truth and Objectivity, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.