Truth and Realism

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Patrick Greenough and Michael P. Lynch (eds.), Truth and Realism, Oxford University Press, 2006, 253pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199288887.

Reviewed by Tim Maudlin, Rutgers University


Truth and Realism contains (with one exception) papers and commentaries delivered at a conference of the same title held at the University of St. Andrews in June 2004. It is divided into three sections: the first on truth and relativism; the second on realism and anti-realism; and the last roughly on the nature and prospects of the philosophical enterprise represented in the first two sections. The book therefore provides a snapshot of the present state of play with respect to some central issues in metaphysics, semantics and epistemology. The overall effect is rather dispiriting.

There is far too much detailed content to discuss comprehensively here, and the problem is not in any particular position or argument. Rather, one gets the sense that there is not even any clear agreement about what the issues are, especially with respect to the topic of realism. Everyone seems to be talking past one another, and often in individually obscure ways.

For example, Michael Williams, in "Realism: What's Left?", claims that the present state of "contemporary Anglophone philosophy" reveals a split not between realists and anti-realists but rather between "neo-pragmatists" and "neo-Cartesians". One of the distinguishing disputes between these camps is that neo-pragmatists are deflationists about truth while neo-Cartesians postulate "a 'robust' notion of correspondence truth which, pace deflationists, will be available for explanatory purposes. Naturally, these ambitions lead neo-Cartesians to favor 'real realism'" (p. 85). Williams makes clear that his allegiance lies in the neo-pragmatist camp, so he rejects both "robust" correspondence truth and "real realism".

Michael Devitt, on the other hand, portrays scientific realism as a claim about the reliability of mature science concerning not-directly-observable entities: "Most of the essential unobservables of well-established current scientific theories exist mind-independently" (p. 102). This statement needs clarification concerning "essential", "well-established" and "mind-independently", some of which Devitt provides, but he insists that no particular theory of truth is being presupposed: "In particular, [the theses of scientific realism] do not involve commitment to a causal theory of reference or a correspondence theory of truth, nor to any other theory of reference or truth. Indeed, they are compatible with a totally deflationary view of reference and truth: a deflationist can be a scientific realist" (pp. 103-4). So Devitt accepts the distinction between a correspondence theory of a truth and a deflationary theory, but says it is not relevant to scientific realism. Devitt's fight is apparently not Williams's.

But then Christopher Gauker does his best to re-install semantic theses into Devitt's position. Indeed Gauker even takes aim at Devitt's use of "mind-independent" in the following remarkable passage: "Inasmuch as the property of being well-established is an epistemic property, which attaches to a theory only insofar as its proponents are in a certain state of mind, we could even say that Devitt's scientific realism makes truth mind-dependent -- contrary to his intention" (p. 126). Beside this being a straightforward non sequitur, this passage seems to reveal an almost willful desire of participants in the discussion to misunderstand one another. Gauker goes on to argue that a scientific realist can't, pace Devitt, be a deflationist, because deflationism itself is not a coherent theory (it doesn't deal with the semantic paradoxes). The latter may be true, but is irrelevant to the claim Devitt makes: there is nothing about scientific realism that precludes deflationism (there may be something about deflationism that precludes deflationism!).

Back in the day, particular instances of realism were a pretty straightforward matter. Early in his career, for example, Mach was famously not a realist about atoms. That is, although he recognized that one could account for some observable facts about chemical combing ratios by the atomic hypothesis, Mach did not believe that matter had an atomic structure or that the atomic theory of matter was true. We might compare Mach's early view about atoms with the present situation with respect to string theory: it is a particular hypothesis about the physical structure of matter, and there is not at present strong evidential grounds to think it correct. Later in life, after the accumulation of more evidence and argumentation (e.g. Einstein's account of Brownian motion), even Mach became convinced. He became a realist about atoms. If one accepts this as a paradigm of the difference between realism about atoms and non-realism, then a wholesale rejection of scientific realism would entail at least suspension of judgment about the atomic theory of matter. From this point of view, anyone rejecting all realism would be in the same camp as those who do not accept that the universe is billions of years old. This leaves open lots of interesting questions -- for example what makes the evidence for atoms so compelling (Gauker argues convincingly that the phrase "inference to the best explanation" does not do justice to this question) -- but would imply that systematic rejection of realism would require systematic skepticism about our present understanding of physical structure. (That understanding includes, of course, that atoms are "mind-independent"; not, as Devitt seems to suggest, because that is part of the thesis of scientific realism but because it is part of the theory of atoms that their existence requires no minds.) Who, then, would not be a realist?

But a completely different account of what it takes to be "real realist" emerges in several of these papers. At the extreme, Williams suggests that to be a "real realist" requires commitment to something Arthur Fine calls the World (as opposed to "the world"): "The World is not our world of familiar things -- shoes and ships and sealing wax -- but a world wholly independent of all of common-sense and scientific beliefs and concepts.  As Richard Rorty says, the idea of the World is 'the notion of something completely unspecified and unspecifiable -- the thing in itself in fact'" (p. 96). If so, why would anyone be a realist, as it demands the postulation of some such completely unspecifiable and unfamiliar entity?

The problem is that Williams gives not even a hint of a reason why real realism should demand belief in the World. Mach's eventual realism about atoms demanded belief in atoms -- atoms that make up shoes and ships and sealing wax, atoms that in the straightforward sense exist independently of minds -- so how would postulation of the World even be relevant? Of course, tying realism to postulation of the World serves a clear rhetorical purpose (viz. to discredit realism), but should realists have to waste time denying that they are committed to the existence of something "completely unspecified and unspecifiable"?

The notion that talk of what exists (or what really exists, or what REALLY exists) carries commitment to some epistemically inaccessible entity can also be found directly in Richard Rorty's remarks here. Rorty tells a just-so story about a "pre-pre-Socratic golden age [when] nobody felt metaphysically emasculated, for phallogocentrism had not yet been invented" (p. 241). The snake in this Eden was Parmenides, who "rolled the grass, the snakes, the gods and the stars into a single well-rounded blob, stood back from it, and called it unknowable. Plato's admiration for this imaginative feat led him to coin the term 'really real'" (p. 240). Rorty wants to lead us back to the prelapserian paradise. It might be worthwhile to note that the historical claim here is perfectly wrong: Parmenides' "one" was supposed to be the one thing that is knowable, the thing described completely by the "path of truth". And Plato similarly reserved a higher sort of being for the mathematicals and the Forms because they were knowable, not because they were unknowable. Rorty's claim that "it is definitory of the really real that there is no agreed-upon way to tell which statements about it are true" (p. 241) gets Plato (the supposed originator of the phrase) exactly backward: mathematics concerns the "really real" because we can prove things about, e.g. squares, and hence come to unshakable agreement, while the best we can get for the physical world is a "likely story" (eikos logos). Should a sensible discussion of realism have to devote time correcting this sort of historical nonsense?

The distinction between "robust" correspondence truth and some other kind of truth (typically deflationary truth) seems to motivate much of the discussion in the book, and is often treated as an obvious, well-known distinction. Since it is not obvious to me, I availed myself of one of the cited references: Paul Howich's Truth (Oxford: Blackwell, 1990). On page nine of that volume we find: "First, there is the venerable notion that truth is the property of corresponding with reality. In its most sophisticated formulations this has been taken to mean that the truth of a statement depends on how its constituents are arranged with respect to one another and on which entities they stand for". May we have a show of hands of those who do not think that the truth of a statement depends on these factors? Horwich goes on to list many different ways to implement this thought, one of which is due to Tarski. The notion here is to take as our model the account of truth commonly given for first-order predicate calculus: a language is interpreted by assigning an element in the domain of interpretation to each singular term, a set of elements to each monadic predicate, and so on. The truth of a sentence is then recursively specified by reference to the interpretation: e.g. a simple subject/predicate sentence is true just in case the object denoted by the singular term is in the set denoted by the predicate. Terry Horgan and Matjaž Potrč, in "Abundant Truth in an Austere World", call this "Direct Correspondence" (DC) semantics, and they claim that the purpose of the philosophical use of the term "really" is to invoke this semantics. How does this claim play out?

Take a garden-variety truth: Jupiter is more massive than the Earth. Horgan and Potrč happily accept this as true -- but not really true. To be really true, "Jupiter" and "the Earth" would have to denote some precise physical entities, but, for standard reasons of vagueness, they do not. (If "the Earth" denoted some precise physical entity, then there would be a fact about whether each individual oxygen atom is part of that entity or not, so an absolutely sharp edge to the Earth's atmosphere. But there is no such edge.) Of course, "Jupiter is more massive than the Earth" is true, it is just not DC true. Rather, it is Austere Indirect Correspondence (AIC) true. One way to "do the metaphysics" that Horgan and Potrč consider is to have only one physical item in the domain of interpretation of AIC semantics: the physical universe as a whole (nothing vague there). So nothing in the domain is denoted by "the Earth" or by "Jupiter". Rather, what makes "Jupiter is more massive than the Earth" AIC true is that the physical universe as a whole is in a particular condition, one of those (many) possible conditions that (somehow) makes "Jupiter is more massive than the Earth" true. So one gets a sort of physicalist Spinozism: there is but one DC referent and only one thing in the physical ontology: the whole cosmos. Garden-variety claims about other "things" are made true not by there really being such things, but by the cosmos being in one or another mode.

(Another possibility is to have some physical simples (such as space-time points) in the domain, together with all their mereological fusions. But again, our linguistic practices do not associate the term "Jupiter" with any particular one of these, so Jupiter would not really exist.)

Given this understanding of the effect of the modifier "really", one's choice is between two options: either there are really no chairs, or there is a fact about exactly which atoms are part of any given chair. And if these are the options, then taking the former seems the lesser of two evils, especially if AIC semantics can make "there are chairs" come out "literally" true. Of course, there are chairs (AIC), there just aren't really any chairs (DC).

Mark Richard does not accept the palatability of this outcome: "At the end of the day, nobody is going to be assuaged by being told that there is a way of understanding talk about chairs on which it comes out true … but there aren't REALLY any chairs. People think there really are chairs. (Really -- just ask them)" (p. 174). I am sympathetic with this remark, but it does not seem to go to the heart of the matter. If my choice is between thinking "Jupiter" denotes some precise physical object (down to the atom) or nothing at all, nothing at all is a very attractive alternative. Even the proverbial man in the street might agree, given these options.

But at this point one loses any clear grip on what the issue is. If, as Horgan and Potrč contend, what it takes for Jupiter to be really real is that "Jupiter" denote some absolutely precise physical object, then everyone but an epistemicist will agree that Jupiter is not really real and the whole physical universe is. If to be really real requires, as Plato would contend, that an entity not change (or exist in time at all) and that it be accessible through pure reasoning, then the physical universe is not really real and numbers are. If, as Rorty says, the really real is partly defined as that about which we cannot agree, then I guess by definition we will not agree about what's really real. If each author is accorded the license to stipulate what is to be understood by "really real", then each author is right in his own terms. And if the issue is what the Folk have in mind when they say something is really real -- well, they probably don't have anything very particular in mind at all.

Wilfrid Sellars used to use the "really" intensifier to introduce some sort of philosophical context: he would say: "Are there numbers? Of course there are! Five is a number. But are there really numbers? Hmmm… Are there minds? Of course there are! Jones has a sharp mind. But are there really minds? Hmmm…" I can attest that to a young graduate student in philosophy, it did seem as though some interesting question were being raised. But Sellars did not say: "Are there chairs? Of course there are, I'm sitting in one right now! But are there really chairs?" Even a young graduate student in philosophy would not know what to make of that "really".

This somewhat nebulous theoretical situation does not infect the first section of the book, which concerns evaluative discourse: matters of morals, ethics, taste and epistemic justification. The section includes "What is Relativism?" by Paul Boghossian, which examines various attempts to make precise the idea that such evaluative judgments might not be absolutely true or false, but only true or false relative to some implicit variable: a particular moral code or standard, for example. This paper was not delivered at the conference, and seems to have been included because Boghossian takes issue with Crispin Wright's attempt to make such relativism logically coherent by appeal to intuitionistic logic or to superassertability. Wright's paper, "Intuititionism, Realism, Relativism and Rhubarb", lays out the argument that the notion of "relative truth" demands such heavy-duty logical and semantic machinery. Wright begins by outlining the "Ordinary View" of matters of personal taste, such as the fact that Tim Williamson thinks that stewed rhubarb is delicious while he, Wright, does not. The Ordinary View holds three theses about such disputes:

1.  that they involve genuinely incompatible attitudes (Contradiction);

2.  that nobody need be mistaken, or otherwise at fault (Faultlessness); and

3.  that the antagonists may, perfectly rationally, stick to their respective views even after the disagreement comes to light and impresses as intractable (Sustainability) (p. 38).

This is a perfectly sensible characterization of the ordinary view concerning rhubarb preferences. Rather remarkably, Wright tries to show that if one accepts standard logic a formal contradiction can be derived from these three theses. If so, then maintaining the Ordinary View would require a change of logic.

How could such commonplace theses possibly lead the ordinary folk into contradiction? The trick is done early, and with little notice. I have followed Wright's characterization exactly above, but suppose instead of "Tim Williamson thinks that stewed rhubarb is delicious" I had written "Tim Williamson finds stewed rhubarb to be delicious". To the common ear, these are just different ways of saying the same thing, but for Wright they make all the difference in the world.

By employing a that clause, Wright insinuates that the difference between himself and Williamson consists in different propositional attitudes toward the same proposition, viz., "Stewed rhubarb is delicious". "The idea that there is genuine disagreement involved in the dispute goes with the idea that there is genuinely indicative content, capable of featuring in attitudes and standing in relations of incompatibility to other contents" (p. 40). But whatever "goes with" means here, the ordinary folk (and even some sophisticated folk) may beg to differ. They might well maintain that although Wright's and Williamson's attitudes are genuinely incompatible, in the sense that no single person can simultaneously have them both, they are not attitudes to any proposition at all: they are rather attitudes toward rhubarb, or towards eating rhubarb, or towards how rhubarb tastes (to the given individual). (In this sense, sitting and standing are genuinely incompatible postures, postures that involve no propositional attitudes.) Wright's and Williamson's attitudes are genuinely incompatible in that Williamson likes and seeks out and looks forward to eating rhubarb, while Wright dislikes and avoids it. It is only by casting this (perfectly genuine!) incompatibility in rhubarb-orientation as different propositional attitudes toward a common proposition that Wright gets his conundrum off the ground. But this is not part of what the ordinary folk think. Maybe it is correct, but Wright offers no justification at all for this key move: he simply writes "goes with", does not explain the locution, and takes the equivalence for granted. Needless to say, without this equivalence issues of logic, or truth, or superassertability never would arise.

JC Beall, in his commentary on Wright, makes Wright's hidden equivalence explicit when he characterizes the key thesis this way:

Contradiction: Such disputes involve genuinely incompatible attitudes (and the conjunction of what the disputants believe is a formal contradiction). (p. 62)

Unsurprisingly, Beall also sees logical problems with the Ordinary View, and suggests paraconsistent rather than intuitionist logic as a possible solution. Surprisingly, Beall seems not to notice the very important difference between his and Wright's formulation of Contradiction, nor consider whether the ordinary folk would plausibly have anything like the parenthetical addition in mind.

The last section of the book, beside Rorty's paper, contains a paper by Paul Horwich with a wholesale rejection of the idea that there is any interesting issue about whether facts about "numbers, oughts, possibilia, and so on" are REAL or not REAL (p. 199). Mathematical, ethical and counterfactual facts strike us a "weird", Horwich claims, simply because they are not similar to physical facts, which we take as a paradigm. But this explanation comes nowhere near to explaining puzzlement about factuality: not only can one have quite different attitudes towards mathematical, normative and counterfactual claims, even these categories cut much too broadly. When you ask mathematicians about which mathematical claims have a classical truth value, you find that almost all accept that 1 + 1 = 2 is true and Goldbach's conjecture is either true or false, but most balk at the Continuum Hypothesis and the Axiom of Choice. So there are particular disputes about "mathematical factuality" that Horwich's broad brush cannot possibly explicate. The section includes a clear commentary on Horwich by Marian David.

This section also contains a paper by Ernest Sosa on the nature of intuition with a commentary by Michael Lynch. Sosa attempts to give a characterization of intuitions that has the consequence that we are epistemically justified in forming beliefs on the basis of our intuitions. The topic is interesting in its own right, but fits at best uneasily with the rest of the papers.

Finally, there is a homily by Timothy Williamson entitled "Must Do Better". The title of the paper accurately conveys the content. Although Williamson makes no specific remarks about the work given at the conference, he takes the whole field to task for sloth and self-indulgence. Good work in philosophy, says Williamson, requires that philosophy be "disciplined" by some constraints:

Discipline from semantics is only one kind of philosophical discipline. It is insufficient by itself for the conduct of a philosophical inquiry, and may sometimes fail to be useful, when the semantic forms of the relevant linguistic constructions are simple and obvious. But when philosophy is not disciplined by semantics, it must be disciplined by something else: syntax, logic, common sense, imaginary examples, the findings of other disciplines (mathematics, physics, biology, psychology, history, etc.) or the aesthetic evaluation of theories (elegance, simplicity, etc.). (p. 182)

Williamson insists that we must be clear and precise. But he is not, himself, precise concerning what sort of precision or disciplining would be likely to yield progress: after all, one way to discipline a theoretical inquiry is to make sure that all conclusions conform to a literal reading of the Bible, but that is presumably not what Williamson has in mind.

In a common rhetorical flourish, Williamson anticipates this sort of objection by preemptively conceding it: "Certainly this paper exhibits hardly any of the virtues it recommends" (p. 187). But to acknowledge a criticism, however graciously, is not to answer it: without a detailed philosophical methodology, calls to "do better" and "be precise" are of little use.

Williamson's final paragraph begins: "In making these comments, it is hard not to feel like the headmaster of a minor public school at speech day, telling everyone to pull their socks up after a particularly bad term". I cannot speak for the participants at the conference, but my own reaction to being compared to a wayward British schoolboy was: So who died and made you headmaster?