Truth and the World: An Explanationist Theory

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Jonathan Tallant, Truth and the World: An Explanationist Theory, Routledge, 2018, 240pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138309777.

Reviewed by Mark Jago, University of Nottingham


Explaining truth is one of the tasks of philosophy, up there on the to-do list along with explaining morality, existence, and consciousness. Grand theories have been constructed, in an attempt to connect truth to the world. Truth depends on the world. Truth is correspondence with the facts. Truths have truthmakers, in virtue of whose existence they are true. Whatever the full story, it's going to be difficult, complex metaphysical stuff. Or so we've been led to believe. Jonathan Tallant challenges this view. He rejects truthmaker theory (as do many). In its place, he puts forward an 'explanationist' theory, on which each truth gets explained without recourse to truthmakers (or corresponding facts, or whatever).

Chapters 1-6 set out and argue against truthmaker theory; chapters 7-10 give and apply the replacement explanationist theory. Truthmaker theory is about grounding the truth of true propositions (chapter 1). It has been used to rule out 'dubious' entities (chapter 2) but, says Tallant, this assumes some prior notion of which entities are dubious, which isn't forthcoming. Internal problems for truthmaker theory then arise in the form of negative existential truths (chapter 3): what in the world could make it true that there are no such things as Hobbits? Some recent attempts to answer the question through 'negative ontology' -- Armstrong's totality facts and my attempt with negative states of affairs -- are discussed and rejected in chapter 4. Chapter 5 discusses and rejects Jonathan Schaffer's priority monism, the view that everything depends on the cosmos as a whole. Chapter 6 argues that truthmakers should be apt for their corresponding truths. Tallant uses this principle in a general argument that the problem of truthmakers for negative existentials is insoluble. That completes Tallant's multi-pronged attack on truthmaker theory.

The explanationist theory appears in chapter 7. Chapter 8 discusses its use in metaphysics and, in particular, how it can be combined with an explanation-based criterion of ontological commitment, to enable us to resolve certain ontological challenges. Chapter 9 shows how the approach doesn't suffer from a problem of negative existentials. The final chapter applies the criterion of ontological commitment from chapter 8 to debates about time and mathematics.

The book is a fun read. Whilst chapters 1-3 cover old ground, chapter 4 offers new arguments against totality and negative facts. (I don't think we negative ontologists should worry, however: you can always check out my What Truth Is if you're curious.) Chapter 5 is a high-speed metaphysical chase sequence in which you're strapped to the underside of an infinitely-ascending rollercoaster. Let me give a flavour. Begin with a priority monist world. Now consider the nihilist view that there are no things with (proper) parts. Add to this world priority relations: nothing has parts, but some things depend on others. Now put it all together as a Monihilistic world: nothing has parts but everything depends on the One Big Object. Now get wilder still: an 'infinite ascent' no-parthood world, in which everything is located within something bigger, without end. Ladies and gentlemen: the Punk world. I can't say I took it all in, but it's a fun ride.

The central core of the book is its development of the explanationist theory, in chapter 7, which is what I'll focus on below. The explanations in question are deductions (146-7) in which we give the conclusion to be explained, that some p is true, in advance (148) and which use nothing else but the T-scheme (and basic logic). The explanation of why p is true then goes like this: p; <p> is true iff p; therefore, <p> is true. So <p> is true because (i) p and (ii) <p> is true iff p. Or, given the T-scheme as background: <p> is true because p. That's it. As you can see, 'no mention has been made of a grounding relation. No mention has been made of a truthmaker relation. No mention has been made of anything other than [the T-scheme], its instances, and the notion of an explanatory deduction' (148-9).

The approach is tidy in the extreme and highly deflationary. So what of ontological commitment? In chapter 8, Tallant proposes 'a distinction . . . between internally true quantified claims and externally true quantified claims' (156). Given your best theories,

work out what kinds of entities are such that, absent those entities, these putative explanations [in the theory] would no longer be explanatory. These are the entities to which we are ontologically committed. A claim that states that such an entity exists is an externally quantified claim. (157)

If mathematical concepts play an indispensable role in explaining physical phenomena, for example, then we'd better take quantification over numbers at face value, as external, ontologically committing quantification. If not, it's internal quantification. In chapter 9, Tallant argues that the explanationist approach 'solves the problem of negative existential propositions' (194). In chapter 10, he applies it to ontological commitment to the past and to mathematical entities, arguing in each case that there is no such commitment. Presentists and mathematical nominalists are off the hook, at least as far as truthmaking objections go.

The explanationist view has antecedents in the literature. One is Joseph Melia's (2005) view that we can have truthmaking without truthmakers, as follows: p makes true <p>. Melia argues that this gives us all the explanation we want without any additional ontological commitment. For 'makes true' acts as a sentential connective, not a relation, and so there is no requirement for entities to do the truthmaking. Similar is Benjamin Schnieder's (2006) analysis, on which all we need is the scheme: it is true that p because p. Schnieder analyses 'because' as a connective, not a relation, and so his approach carries no commitment to truthmaking entities. Both views are very close to Tallant's (Melia also uses his view as a defence of nominalism, for example), so it's strange these views aren't discussed.

Another antecedent is Kit Fine's (2012) theory of grounding, on which 'grounds' is a sentential connective. We can say: p grounds it's true that p. Fine argues against truthmaker theory on the basis that it posits a truthmaking relation and worldly truthmakers whereas (given grounds as a connective) no such things are required. Tallant doesn't mention Fine's approach, but it would be interesting to compare these approaches.

What of the explanationist approach itself? I worry that the specific form of explanation Tallant offers -- as derivation using only the T-scheme -- does too little and too much, all at once. Too little, because it misses explanations such as these:

(1) <Hesperus exists> is true because Venus exists

(2) <Hesperus is Phosphorus> is true because Venus exists

(3) The first proposition I thought of this morning is true because I'm hungry

We can't get these using just the T-scheme. Of course, we can add extra premises ('Hesperus is Venus') to derive them. But we then need to explain why this form of explanation permits such substitutions. 'Because' is a hyperintensional operator and, in general, hyperintensional operators (like 'necessarily') don't permit substitution. By contrast, truthmaker theory easily explains its validity: there's a worldly relation between proposition and truthmaker and worldly relations permit substitution.

The approach does too much because (as a first pass) we can also derive that snow is white from <snow is white>'s being true and the T-scheme, yet the latter doesn't explain the former. Tallant replies that not all such deductions are explanations (150). Which ones are? Tallant's 'fallback' position is that there's no need to give a general account, since 'we have a perfectly clear sense of when deductions are explanatory' (150). Perhaps we do, but the fallback position then looks poor compared to theories which do explain why just one direction of the T-scheme is explanatory.

Tallant 'tentatively' offers one such theory, built on the premise that the T-scheme exhausts the nature of truth, but not the nature of snow, or being white, or whatever (152). In general, suppose instances of

(4) X is F iff G

exhaust the nature of being F. Then G 'gives rise to an explanation of . . . X is F' (150). But this approach still over-generates explanations of truth. Any p features in infinitely many T-instances, including:

(5) <p> is true iff <<p> is true> is true.

The tentative theory then predicts, incorrectly, that <<p> is true>'s being true explains why <p> is true.

The explanationist approach also faces a host of technical issues, which buzz like flies around the T-scheme. What are its instances? All such sentences? Inconsistency! (Because of the Liar.) Only such sentences? You missed some truths! (Because some truths aren't expressed by any sentence.) Setting this to one side, we're still stuck with cases like:

(6) For every real number r, <r is a real number> is true because r is a real number.

No derivation can contain all the instances since derivations are countable (even if we allow them to be infinite). A finite derivation will begin by assuming that r is an arbitrary real number and inferring the truth of the proposition that it is so. To be sound, 'r' must be either a variable or a previously unused constant (i.e. one not appearing in any other premise of the derivation). Either way, there's no suitable T-instance premise to use (for T-instances are sentences which contain no unbound variables and, by hypothesis, none contains 'r' considered as a constant).

As for the applications of the theory, I didn't see how presentists or mathematical nominalists get off the hook. Here's the attempt in the case of past entities (§10.1). We explain why <there were dinosaurs> is true by using the T-scheme to derive its truth from the premise that there were dinosaurs. In short, <there were dinosaurs> is true because there were dinosaurs. Supposedly, 'this gets the presentist out of any bind' because 'there is no entity playing an indispensable explanatory role in explaining the truth of the true proposition' (207).

I don't think the presentist gets off so lightly, for we still need to examine the commitments of there were dinosaurs. Consider Tallant's test for ontological commitment (157) in our theorising about (say) why we now find dinosaur bones. My explanation goes: there used to be dinosaurs, with bones; now there're just the bones. We're ontologically committed to entities when 'absent those entities, these putative explanations would no longer be explanatory' (157). But dinosaurs are essential to my little explanation. Take them out and you've just got the bones, which is what you're trying to explain. So, says the test, we're ontologically committed to dinosaurs. Presentists may reasonably respond: the explanation doesn't need existing dinosaurs, only dinosaurs in the past. I'm claiming only that the explanation is no good unless you mention dinosaurs and hence that we're ontologically committed to dinosaurs.

The same goes for Tallant's approach the mathematical ontology (§10.3). He's a nominalist (219). Explaining why <2+2=4> is true is 'easy', for 'the best explanation . . . goes no further than because 2+2=4' (220). But again, the number 2 seems essential to that explanation; without it, the putative explanation wouldn't be explanatory. So Tallant's test seems to tell us we're ontologically committed to the number 2. (Interestingly, Melia uses his 'truthmaking without truthmakers' theory to argue in favour of nominalism about properties but not in defence of presentism or mathematical nominalism.) There's an escape route if <2+2=4> can be paraphrased out of our best theory. Maybe the language of numbers is theoretically eliminable from our best scientific theories (220-3). I'm skeptical. Tallant takes it to be up to realists to show that it can't be done (220); I say it's up to nominalists to show that it can. These positions are well entrenched in the indispensability debate. I don't see the explanationist approach generating movement.

Some of the worries I've just sketched are technical problems, which can probably be worked around. And debates over ontological commitment are notoriously fiddly. It's hardly a surprise the issue hasn't been settled definitively here.

I have a lingering big picture worry. It's somewhat fuzzy, so bear with me. Tallant understands the crucial philosophical demand, explain truth!, as the demand to explain why a proposition <p>, specified by a sentence 'p', gets to have the property being true. Easy: because p! But if that really were the full content of the demand, then why the big fuss? Why so much wasted ink over truth and truthmaking? Could it be that truthmaker theorists had something deeper and more demanding in mind? (Tallant discusses where maximalists may have gone wrong in §9.4. But could it be that even non-maximalist truthmaker theorists are seriously confused?) In attempting to get to the bottom of the matter, I wrote to the TTU (Truthmaker Theorist's Union). Here's what they said:

Let's say you don't believe in mind-independent objects, yet you agree there's a chair in the otherwise empty room. Were we to go in there, you say, we'd have a chair-like experience. That's what you mean by 'there's a chair there'. But why would we have that chair-like experience? You can't say: because there's a chair there! Your explanation stops with possible experiences: we just would have such-and-such experiences. At this point, the Union is not happy. The world doesn't 'bottom out' with possible experience. We have experiences for a reason: maybe they occur in virtue of our brain states. And such-and-such things would or would not happen for a reason: maybe in virtue of ultimate dispositional properties, maybe not.

In pushing back at the phenomenalist's story, the Union is asking an ontological question. We can phrase it as: what makes your counterfactual true? In virtue of what? Show me your truthmaker! But we needn't. We don't need to use the word 'true'. We'll spot you that <you'd have such-and-such experience> is true because you would have such-and-such experience. But the Union asks you kindly to get to the explanation we're after: in virtue of what do you claim we would have that experience? 'True' is a convenient expressive device. We may say, 'everything Stephen Fry says is true'. Likewise, we often say, 'give us a truthmaker for everything you say is true'. But in each specific case, we can make our demand directly. It's about your ontology. You don't count as answering that demand, for each case p, merely by saying: because p.

-- Regards, the TTU.


Fine, Kit, 2012, 'Guide to ground', in F. Correia and B. Schnieder (eds.), Metaphysical Grounding: Understanding the Structure of Reality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 37-80.

Lewis, David, 1999, 'A world of truthmakers?', in his Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 215-20.

Melia, Joseph, 2005, 'Truthmaking without truthmakers', in H. Beebee and J. Dodd (eds.), Truthmakers: the Contemporary Debate, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 67-84.

Schnieder, Benjamin, 2006, 'Truth-making without truth-makers', Synthese 152: 21-46.