Truth and Truth Bearers: Meaning in Context, Volume II

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Mark Richard, Truth and Truth Bearers: Meaning in Context, Volume II, Oxford University Press, 2015, 287pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198747765.

Reviewed by Manuel García-Carpintero, University of Barcelona


This is the second compilation of Mark Richard's papers, after Context and the Attitudes. It has three parts with, respectively, papers on time and tense, on relativism and truth-bearers, and on quotation and opacity. Like the previous volume, this one includes both important papers that deservedly had a great impact on contemporary philosophy and some new material; hence it is very welcome. Researchers working on the philosophy of language (broadly conceived), the philosophy of mind, and metaphysics will want to have both compilations at hand. I'll describe the contents of each part, making small critical observations in passing.

Part I contains two papers from Richard's dissertation, "Temporalism and Eternalism" (1981) and "Tense, Propositions, and Meaning" (1982), and a previously unpublished one, "Temporalism and Eternalism Revisited", written between 2003 and 2009. The earliest of these is frequently cited, but, as Richard acknowledges in the introduction, there have been serious objections to it. His new paper addresses those objections.

Propositions are usually understood in terms of their role: they provide the contents of attitudes like belief and of speech acts like assertion and they are bearers of truth-values. As David Kaplan (1989, 503-4) put it, propositions are supposed to be "modally neutral", in that an assertion made by uttering 'snow is white' (or the belief expressed by it) is supposed to be the same whether it is made with respect to a world like the actual one of which it is true, or to one with relevantly different facts of which it would be false. Temporalism, which Kaplan endorses, is the view that some propositions are also temporally neutral, or temporal for short: the same proposition is asserted and the same belief is expressed by, say, utterances of 'Obama is president' both at times at which it is true and at times at which it is not.

"Temporalism and Eternalism" advances a simple prima facie compelling argument against this view. The objection is that, against what seems intuitively right, the view appears to validate inferences like the following on plausible assumptions -- including the one that the second past tense in the first premise is semantically vacuous:

Mary believed that Obama was president.

Mary still believes everything she once believed.

Therefore, Mary believes that Obama is president.

The problem with this argument becomes clear once we appreciate a point that some have made following Lewis (1980),[1] and that Richard made independently in his 1982 paper in reply to Kaplan's (1989, 503) infamous "operator argument" for temporalism.[2] Kaplan argues that we need to ascribe temporal semantic contents to sentences, so that operators like the past tense have something to properly operate on, by shifting time indexes -- the way modally neutral contents allow modal operators like 'possibly' to shift world indexes. The Lewisian point in reply, using a terminology that has become standard today, is that we should distinguish the compositional semantic value of a declarative sentence from its assertoric content. The former is the value that a semantic theory should ascribe to it in order to fulfill its explanatory tasks -- in particular, by making semantic content adequately compositional. The latter is something like the proposition that would be asserted by an utterance of the sentence in a "default" or "typical" context. The semantic value of a sentence might relativize its truth-value to parameters of all kinds, in particular temporal parameters, a point that respects that made by Kaplan about tense operators. The assertoric content might still end up being temporally specific (by the assertoric context supplying a time), as eternalism claims.Mary believes that Obama is president.

Semantic and assertoric content must be related, because the intuitive evidence for theories of natural language, including evidence for compositionality, is directly about assertoric contents, but only indirectly about semantic values. However, Lewis (1980) and the other researchers convincingly argue that the relation doesn't need to be identity. Writers like Jeffrey King and Jason Stanley assume instead that we do need a closer identification between semantic value and assertoric content. They provide an alternate reply to the operator argument, maintaining that tenses are not operators but quantifiers. Even if this is so, Brian Rabern compellingly shows that the compositional semantic values of sentences remain temporally neutral, without this providing in any way an argument for temporalism, which is a view about assertoric contents.[3]

Now, Richard's argument appeals to our intuitions that the argument above about Mary and Obama is invalid. These intuitions are equally about assertoric contents, not directly about semantic values, and so the relevance of the previous distinction to deflate the argument is not immediately obvious. But in fact, as predicted by the Lewisian pluralism on semantic contents (and as Lewis already pointed out) our intuitions about such matters are much less straightforward than the argument acknowledges. Other cases (which Richard discusses, 50ff.) prima facie point in a different direction:

It was safe to hitchhike in the sixties.

Nobody believes that anymore.

Therefore, nobody believes that it is safe to hitchhike.

The most recent piece is devoted to analyzing data like these, and to argue that eternalism is still the safer bet. I will not go into the arguments here but will simply conclude with a methodological remark. As Richard says (3), in the earlier papers he already took these arguments as having an empirical character; he doubts there are good a priori arguments against relativizing (assertoric) contents (5-6). I cannot agree more. I also doubt that there are compelling arguments that the contents of assertions and beliefs cannot be neutral with respect to parameters other than worlds (García-Carpintero 2013). On the contrary, there might well be good reasons to ascribe them to some representational states -- say, some perceptual or emotional experiences, and their linguistic expression. Now, Richard suggests (9) that his more recent work on relativism is thereby consistent with his earlier rejection of temporalism. While granting this, one might nonetheless feel some tension here. I suspect that if a person assumed the relativist commitments espoused by Richard in the papers I am about to discuss without having taken previously a stance in the disputes about temporalism, she would be hardly moved by the considerations against it in the pieces we have just glossed.

Part II includes Richard's recent work on relativism. It starts with the much discussed  "Contextualism and Relativism" (2004), which anticipated his When Truth Gives Out (2008). In addition, the section contains two previously published papers and two new ones, which elaborate on different aspects of Richard's relativist views. "Indeterminacy and Truth Value Gaps" (2010) develops his three-valued view on vagueness, which appeals to a distinction between the speech act of denying p and the assertion of the negation of p. Richard has motivated his relativism on the basis of the "built-in slack" (9) that many of our concepts come with, such as those expressed by gradable adjectives like 'rich', so this discussion of vagueness is relevant. "What are Propositions" (2014) articulates Richard's Russellian view of propositions as states of affairs. Significant here for the issue of relativism is his (correct, in my view) contention that truth as a property of representational states has explanatory priority vis-à-vis truth as a property of their propositional contents (5-6, 143). The hitherto unpublished "What Is Disagreement?" and "Relativisms" helpfully clarify and partially revise the views about disagreement and truth-relativism in the earlier work.

In previous work defending contextualism from recent arguments for relativism (including Richard's in the 2004 paper [García-Carpintero 2007, 2013; Marques and García-Carpintero, 2014]), I have emphasized the importance of following Gareth Evans's discussion of these issues in distinguishing between a "moderate" and a "radical" view. The articulation of a relativist view begins with a notion of semantic contents neutral with respect to parameters other than possible worlds, such as times in the already discussed case of temporalism, or standards of taste or value in the more usual cases. However, relativism (like temporalism, a particular case thereof) is a claim about assertoric contents. We are led to distinguish between the two varieties when we consider the truth-related properties of the assertoric acts and the beliefs they express.

On the moderate content view, the truth of the relevant assertoric contents is to be relativized to parameters other than a possible world, like the truth of the compositional semantic values they correspond to. However, the truth (or truth-related correctness) of the assertion itself and the belief it expresses are not relative, but absolute. This is because on the content view the context in which the act is made provides once and for all the values of the relevant parameters for the appraisal: the world, the time, the standard of taste, say. On the more interesting state variety that Richard, John MacFarlane and others have espoused, this is still relative, to be evaluated relative to different stances providing the parameters needed. The same assertion/belief can thus be correct or otherwise, relative to different perspectives.

I have agreed above with Richard that there is no good a priori reason to dismiss semantic values and corresponding assertoric contents whose truth is relative to parameters other than possible worlds. However, in work mentioned above I elaborated on Evans's a priori skepticism about state relativism. The concern assumes that the relevant representational states are constitutively normative. It queries, in a nutshell, whether an act (judgment or assertion) should be appraised by a norm to which the agent is in no way committed at the time at which she performs it, so that she might be rationally required to retract it. Both MacFarlane's assessment-sensitive relativism and Richard's own variety imply this (107).

My feeling is that the more recent papers manifest a rapprochement of sorts between the sophisticated form of contextualism that many of us have been led to defend in partial acknowledgement of the data invoked by relativists, and the equally sophisticated form of relativism that Richard's more recent work outlines. We should agree with Richard (108-9) that full competence with terms such as 'rich (for a New Yorker)', 'tasty', '(aesthetically) beautiful', '(morally) good' associates with each only a notion which by itself fails to specify the indeterminacy-ridden extension that the concept associated with any specific deployment of it in a particular context expresses. This allows for cases in which two speakers who have sharpened the notions in different ways respectively predicate and deny one of those terms of the same object, with respect to which we have prima facie impressions of disagreement -- as when, in Richard's example, Jane claims that Mary is rich (for a New Yorker) and June the opposite, having sharpened their common notion into different concepts.

Sophisticated contextualists deal with the data by pursuing these strategies (Marques and García-Carpintero, 2014): (i) doing away with the impression of disagreement, by making explicit the relativity to different standards ("I was right, I only meant that Mary was rich relative to the standards I was contemplating at the time"); (ii) granting that there is a real disagreement, but that it is "metalinguistic" ("it is my standard that is pertinent here"); (iii) finding a hidden false presupposition whose truth would have provided for a real disagreement ("we share standards"); (iv) granting that there is a disagreement, but that it is "practical" ("let's agree on a standard!"); or (v) arguing that speakers are semantically ignorant of some of the foregoing.

Richard considers a form of sophisticated contextualism (97). He doesn't object that it appeals to ad hoc resources, or that it is in any case much more complex than the relativist account -- to a large extent because, as we are about to see, his own considered proposal needs to appeal to very similar resources. His complaint is instead that "if we take this proposal seriously, we will conclude that the relativist's account of disagreement is correct" (98). The argument for this, however, overlooks the distinctions we have been making above. He says that, by granting a common core to the meaning of 'rich' that Jane and June respectively predicate and deny of Mary (relative to their different sharpenings), we acknowledge that they understand each other, and hence may represent themselves as respectively saying that Mary is rich and that Mary is not rich. "But it seems perverse to admit all of this while not drawing the obvious . . . inference that Jane and June are saying incompatible things" (99).

But there is nothing perverse in this. As argument (2) above illustrates, intuitions about content are very lax. If Jane and June uttered, respectively, 'Obama is president' and 'Obama is not president' at different times (or 'I am hungry'/'I am not hungry'), they can be described as having said and denied the same thing, without allowing the inference that they are saying incompatible things. The same of course applies to speakers who utter 'snow is white' and 'snow is not white' at different worlds. Richard acknowledges this (87-8) and maintains that even if the utterances have relativist contents (temporal contents, or Lewisian subject-neutral de se contents), there is no serious disagreement in such cases. He thus grants that the simpleminded account of disagreement that some relativists have assumed, on which this is just a matter of accepting and denying the same content, is unacceptably flat-footed (6, 87-8).

Disagreement, Richard now contends, requires in addition something like what sophisticated contextualism posits: a presupposition that there is some reason (possibly practical) for evaluating beliefs or assertions relative to the same standards (94-5). One might complain here that Richard should perhaps have discussed whether some of the objections he raised in the 2004 paper to contextualist incarnations of this sort of proposal (66) might not affect his own new proposal. This appears to be so of the objection concerning disagreements between individuals that are not in the same conversation, and the one about the absence of the phenomenology of making proposals for sharpening vague concepts.

Aside from this, I note that, as indicated above, state relativism is a controversial view, involving funny-looking claims like the one that we should retract an assertion or give up a belief we know to be true -- not just for spurious practical reasons, but in virtue of facts constitutive of what assertions and beliefs are. In attempting to deflate this, Richard points out: "it is possible for us to improve our cognitive position by giving up some of our true beliefs. Of course, when we do this, we don't trade them in for false beliefs . . . we simultaneously revise our standards and our beliefs" (110). But this is slightly disingenuous: indeed, the new beliefs are not false relative to the new standards, but false relative to the standards relative to which we formed the ones we are now (rationally!) abandoning. Now, as Dretske once memorably put it, in philosophy we are all doomed to talk funny, and perhaps it is ultimately a matter of taste which jokes one chooses to allow. But given this consequence of the relativist view, and my taste for what is too funny to indulge in philosophy, my main complaint about Richard's new package is that, ceteris paribus, we shouldn't adopt a view as controversial as his unless there is very good reason to do so; but once relativists grant that they also need to adopt the complexities of the contextualist account of impressions of disagreement, cetera come to be paria.

Richard's sensible views on the ascription of attitudes, discussed in Propositional Attitudes (1990), and in Context and the Attitudes, emphasized the relation between contents and their (linguistic, or mental) articulation. The essays in Part III concern philosophical issues that this relation raises.

The previously published "Quotation, Grammar, and Opacity" (1986) and "Opacity" (2008), and previously unpublished "Did I Mention What He Said", discuss issues about quotation and opacity -- in particular the opacity prima facie induced by quotation. The first two provide forceful critical discussions of Quine's and Davidson's views on quotation and opacity. They also defend (and distinguish from Quine's) a Tarskian name view of quotations. It was not very popular when originally published, but has since come to be a standard contender, to a large extent also through its careful development in Mario Gómez-Torrente's work on this topic.[4]

"Opacity" (211-213) considers one of the main reasons I myself have invoked for an alternative Davidsonian demonstrative view. This is the context-dependence of quotations, in particular the point that we can use them to refer to tokens (see García-Carpintero 2012, and earlier work mentioned there). I have doubts that Richard's proposal for dealing with this is truly compatible with Tarskian views.[5] A critical discussion of these views should also examine how they deal with "mixed quotation", as in 'Lionel said that Joseph "is a horse's patoot"', involving an apparent mixture of use and mention. "Did I Mention What He Said" makes an interesting proposal about them, outlining an account of how the content assigned to such sentences might be compositionally generated.

The final two papers develop the theme that some terms make structured contributions to semantic content. "Articulated terms" (1993) presents a view on which terms and phrases, such as 'logicism' and 'that mathematics reduces to logic", end up making the same contribution to semantic content -- thus being in a certain sense "directly referential" -- while having different structures leading to this content. Among other things, this has consequences for what it takes to fully understand a sentence including each of those terms. "Analysis, Synonymy, and Sense" (2001) uses these ideas to deal with Moore's "paradox of analysis".

With characteristic flair, Richard concludes his introduction by saying that writing the papers was fun and that he hopes reading them will be fun too. I am not sure whether I would use that adjective, but the book certainly allows us to engage with clearly articulated thought-provoking philosophical views which deserve to be carefully thought through.


Financial support for my work was provided by the DGI, Spanish Government, research project FFI2013-47948-P and the award ICREA Academia for excellence in research, 2013, funded by the Generalitat de Catalunya. Thanks to Dan Zeman for comments on a previous version, and to Michael Maudsley for his grammatical revision.


Brogaard, Berit (2011): Transient Truths, Oxford University Press.

Cappelen, Herman and Lepore, Ernie (2007): Language Turned on Itself, Oxford University Press.

Evans, Gareth (1985): "Does Tense Logic Rest upon a Mistake?", in his Collected Papers, Clarendon Press, 343-363.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (2006): "Recanati on the Semantics/Pragmatics Distinction," Crítica 38, 35-68.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (2008): "Relativism, Vagueness and What Is Said", in García-Carpintero, M. and Kölbel, M. (eds.), Relative Truth, Oxford University Press, 129-154.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (2012): "Minimalism about Quotation", Philosophical Studies, 161, 207-225.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (2013): 'Critical Study: Relativism and Monadic Truth', Philosophical Quarterly, 63, 597-602, DOI: 10.1111/1467-9213.1201.

Gómez-Torrente, Mario (2013): "How Quotations Refer", Journal of Philosophy 110 (7), 123-153.

Kaplan, David (1989): "Demonstratives", in J. Almog, J. Perry and H. Wettstein (eds.), Themes from Kaplan, Oxford University Press, 481-563.

King, Jeffrey and Stanley, Jason (2005): "Semantics, Pragmatics, and The Role of Semantic Content", in Semantics vs. Pragmatics, Z. Szabo (ed.), Oxford University Press, 111-164.

MacFarlane, John (2014): Assessment Sensitivity: Relative Truth and Its Applications. Oxford University Press.

Marques, Teresa, & García-Carpintero, Manuel (2014): "Disagreement about taste: commonality presuppositions and coordination", Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 72 (4), 701-23, DOI: 10.1080/00048402.2014.922592.

Ninan, Dilip (2012): "Propositions, Semantic Values, and Rigidity", Philosophical Studies 158(3), 401-13.

Rabern, Brian (2012): "Against the Identification of Assertoric Content with Compositional Value", Synthese 189(1), 75-96.

[1] Cf. García-Carpintero (2006, 2008); Ninan (2012); Rabern (2012).

[2] The rejoinder that follows is considered in section 3 of the 1981 paper; "Temporalism and Eternalism Revisited" explicitly acknowledges the main point made below, cf. fn. 15, 48.

[3] This point is missed by Brogaard (2011), who otherwise provides a good summary of these debates in the context of a defence of temporalism. Having assumed that temporalism may countenance some eternal propositions, she considers a claim by Ludlow that there are not untensed predications in natural language, and she says (ibid., 14) that, if this is so, "evidently there are not eternal propositions". Far from being evident, this simply doesn't follow at all.

[4] Cf. Gómez-Torrente (2013), and previous work referred to there. Although on both Richard's and Gómez-Torrente's views quotations are not syntactico-semantically structured, they correctly ascribe them a "lexical" (Richard) or "morphological" structure (Gómez-Torrente). Cappelen and Lepore (2007) defend a related "minimal theory", consisting mostly in the main interpretive principle that both Gómez-Torrente and Richard invoke for quotation, Gómez-Torrente's (2013, 370) "interiority principle" that a quotation refers to the expression within its quotation marks.

[5] Richard's proposal (213) is in effect to add a second "interiority principle", specific for tokens (possibly of non-expressions). But prima facie, this would leave the proposal open to one of the main objections that both Gómez-Torrente (2013, 359) and Cappelen and Lepore (2007, 120ff.) level against demonstrative accounts, namely, that only in some contexts would '"Socrates"' refer to 'Socrates' be true -- on Richard's proposal, those in which the same interiority principle is invoked in both cases. Not that I think much of this objection (García-Carpintero 2012, 215-6), but my reply depends on assuming a demonstrative account.