Truth and Truth-Making

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E. J. Lowe and A. Rami (eds.), Truth and Truth-Making, Acumen, 2009, 262pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773535558.

Reviewed by David Efird, University of York



Some propositions are true. But that they are true is not a fundamental feature of reality. That is, truth is not metaphysically primitive; it is metaphysically grounded. That truth is so grounded is the primary motivation for truth-making1 theory, the theory according to which if a proposition is true, it is true in virtue of something, or, more accurately, some thing. The elaboration and evaluation of this theory is the subject matter of the present anthology, Truth and Truth-Making. In what follows, I review the construction of the anthology and then question whether the thought that truth is not metaphysically primitive but rather metaphysically grounded leads necessarily to the thought that if a proposition is true, it is true in virtue of some thing.

Truth-making theory is a so-called ‘hot topic’ in metaphysics. Not only does it aim to elucidate what seems to be a commonly held intuition, namely, that truth is not metaphysically primitive but rather metaphysically grounded, but also it promises a way of disciplining metaphysics. This discipline is achieved by providing a criterion by which a metaphysical account can be judged to be inadequate. If a metaphysical account cannot provide a truth-maker, i.e., a thing in virtue of which a proposition is true, for each of the truths it claims to be true, then it is inadequate. Such a criterion can then enable progress in metaphysics. It is no wonder then that there are many papers, monographs, and anthologies on this topic, amongst which Truth and Truth-making joins their number.

While all of the papers in this anthology are valuable contributions to the elaboration and evaluation of truth-making theory, the principal problem with this anthology is that it aims to be both a reader on truth-making theory and a collection of new essays on truth-making theory, all in 262 pages. It accomplishes neither aim well by attempting to fulfil both aims at the same time. The previously published papers are: Kevin Mulligan, ‘Truth and the truth-maker principle in 1921’ (previously published in German); Kevin Mulligan, Peter Simons and Barry Smith, ‘Truth-makers’; Greg Restall, ‘Truth-makers, entailment and necessity’; David Lewis, ‘Truth-making and difference-making’; D.M. Armstrong, ‘The general theory of truth-making’; and Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, ‘Why truth-makers’.

These are all important papers that shape the present debate on truth-making theory. However, they are by no means an exhaustive list of such papers. Consequently, a reader new to the truth-making debate would find it difficult to understand the contours of the debate by reading just those papers listed above.

It would have been a valuable service for the editors to gather all of the debate-shaping papers into an anthology to serve as a handy reference for those engaged in the debate and as a way to bring those new to the topic up to speed on the debate. In my own view, the following papers, in addition to those listed above, would constitute such an anthology:

Bertrand Russell, ‘The Philosophy of Logical Atomism’, Monist 28 (1918): 495-527, relevant sections.

Ludwig Wittgenstein, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (London: Routledge, 1922), relevant sections.

D.M Armstrong, A World of States of Affairs (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), relevant sections.

John Fox, ‘Truthmaker’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 65 (1987): 188-207.

C.B. Martin, ‘How It Is: Entities, Absences and Voids’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74 (1996): 57-65.

Josh Parsons, ‘There is No “Truthmaker” Argument Against Nominalism’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 77 (1999): 325-34.

George Molnar, ‘Truthmakers and Negative Truths’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 78 (2000): 72-86.

Stephen Read, ‘Truthmakers and the Disjunction Thesis’, Mind 109 (2000): 67-79.

David Lewis, ‘Things qua Truthmakers’, and Gideon Rosen and David Lewis, ‘Postscript to “Things qua Truthmakers”’, both in Lillehammer and Rodriguez-Pereyra (eds.), Real Metaphysics (London: Routledge, 2003), 25-42.

Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, ‘Truthmaking, Entailment, and the Conjunction Thesis’, Mind 115 (2006): 957-82.

Ross Cameron, ‘How to be a Truthmaker Maximalist’, Noûs 42 (2008): 410-21.

However, the editors did not aim to provide such a comprehensive anthology. Instead, they paired a selection of debate-shaping papers with new papers taking forward the debate.

These new papers are: Marian David, ‘Truth-making and correspondence’; Herbert Hochberg, ‘Facts and relations: the matter of ontology and truth-making’; Paul Horwich, ‘Being and truth’; E.J. Lowe, ‘An essentialist approach to truth-making’; and Josh Parsons, ‘Are there irreducibly relational facts?’.

In addition, there are new postscripts to Restall’s ‘Truth-makers, entailment and necessity’ and to Rodriguez-Pereyra’s, ‘Why truth-makers’ wherein these authors deal with objections to their original papers and give indications of their current thoughts on truth-making. Because these papers have not previously been published, I will provide a brief summary of them.

Marian David elucidates the relationship between truth-making and the correspondence theory of truth, according to which a proposition is true just in case it corresponds with a fact. It is often remarked that truth-making theory captures what is true in the correspondence theory of truth, but just how truth-making theory is related to the correspondence theory of truth is left unclear. David makes a very valuable contribution to the elaboration and evaluation of truth-making theory and correspondence theory by delineating a series of bridge principles that link the two theories. In this way, he precisely displays their relationship, which then makes possible the evaluation of one in light of the other. Consequently, David has enabled progress to occur in the metaphysics of truth.

Herbert Hochberg considers the ontology required for truth-making, in particular that of facts and relations. While most truth-making theorists look back only to Russell and Wittgenstein to provide metaphysical resources for truth-making, Hochberg brings medieval metaphysics into the debate, particularly that of Peter Abelard. Hochberg’s putting Abelard’s metaphysics in conversation with that of Russell and Moore and also with contemporary trope theory is highly enlightening. Anyone interested in the history of metaphysics would do well to study this paper.

Paul Horwich argues that claims of truth-making, e.g. ‘x makes true <p>’ are best understood as ‘x explains (constitutively) why <p> is true’, or more simply, ‘p because x exists’. He then argues that the explanatorily fundamental propositions are not, as truth-making theory has it, existential propositions. Consequently, being is not basic, according to Horwich, contrary to truth-making theory. Horwich presents a strong challenge to truth-making theory that any proponent must take seriously. For my part, I disagree with Horwich that truth-making claims are best understood as explanatory claims, unless ‘explanation’ is taken in a metaphysical sense, not considered by Horwich. Nevertheless I agree with him that being is not metaphysically basic.

E. J. Lowe accepts that true propositions are made true by entities, and that these entities provide a ‘metaphysical explanation’ for why a true proposition is true. Now, the truth-making relation is typically taken to be one of necessitation; that is, a proposition is true only if there is something such that, necessarily, if it exists, that proposition is true. If the truth-making relation is so understood, then necessary truths are made true by anything whatsoever, which seems to trivialize the relation. In order to avoid this result, Lowe proposes that a proposition is true only if there is something such that it is part of the essence of that proposition that it is true if that thing exists. While Lowe’s proposal seems to deal adequately with preventing the truth-making relation from being trivial in the case of necessary truths, it does so by invoking essences of propositions, which to my mind are never adequately explained.

Josh Parsons argues that, given all the facts required to make true non-relational truths, there would still be required further facts to make true relational truths. If Parson’s argument is correct, it sheds light on the origins of analytic philosophy, particularly Russell’s break with Bradley’s Hegelian idealism over Bradley’s view of relations. Consequently, Parsons’ paper should be of interest not only to truth-making theorists but also to historians of analytic philosophy.

All of the these papers are valuable contributions to the elaboration and evaluation of truth-making theory and take the debate forward in all of its many aspects. Readers are left wanting more, though, having had their appetite for the debate whetted. It is at this point that the reader wishes that new papers on truth-making theory completely made up the volume which is, instead, half reader on truth-making theory and half new papers.

But enough of what I would have done had I been the editor of this anthology. It is appropriate at this point to express appreciation to the editors for collecting some of the most influential papers in shaping the debate on truth-making theory and commissioning some papers which will clearly be influential in taking that debate forward. I recommend this anthology to anyone interested in the metaphysics of truth.

In conclusion, I would like to question whether the thought that truth is not metaphysically primitive but rather metaphysically grounded leads necessarily to the thought that if a proposition is true, it is true in virtue of some thing. Rodriguez-Pereyara, in ‘Why truth-makers’, puts forward a simple argument for truth being grounded in entities:

(1) Truth is grounded.

(2) Grounding is a relation.

(3) Relations link entities.

(4) Therefore, truth is grounded in entities. (p. 234 of the present anthology)

Let us for the sake of argument accept premise (1). Now if premises (2) and (3) are correct, not only is truth grounded in entities, but also truth itself is an entity. But that doesn’t seem correct, nor is it what is intended, I expect. To avoid this result, (1) is better construed as:

(1*) A proposition’s being true is grounded.

What (1*) suggests is that a proposition having a certain property, namely, being true, needs metaphysical grounding, or metaphysical explanation. Now sometimes an object’s having a property is metaphysically grounded in, or metaphysically explained by, that same object having a different property, such as, controversially, my having certain mental properties is metaphysically grounded, or metaphysically explained by, my having certain physical properties. In light of this way of understanding the grounding relation, we can construe it not as something that links entities, but rather as something that links properties. In the case at hand, the grounding relation is one which links properties had by propositions. That is, that a proposition’s being true is metaphysically grounded in, or metaphysically explained, by that same proposition having another property.

What could this property be? Michael Dummett has suggested that God’s knowing a proposition is different from our knowing it. Expanding on this suggestion, for us a proposition’s being true is prior to our knowing it, but this is not the case for God: God’s knowing a proposition is prior to its being true. With this suggestion in mind, I propose that a proposition’s being true is metaphysically grounded in, or metaphysically explained by, God’s knowing that proposition, where, following Timothy Williamson, knowledge is not analyzable in terms of truth. That is, truth is grounded in God’s knowledge.2 Now this is not the time to develop this suggestion further, but what it shows is that one can accept that truth is grounded without accepting that truth is grounded in entities by taking the grounding relation as one that concerns properties rather than entities.

1 Here I follow the convention in the present anthology of writing ‘truth-making’ instead of ‘truthmaking’ and ‘truth-maker’ instead of ‘truthmaker’ apart from when ‘truthmaking’ and ‘truthmaker’ appear within quoted text.

2 Given God’s omniscience, necessarily, a proposition is true just in case God knows it, but what is suggested here is that God’s knowing the proposition is what metaphysically explains the proposition’s being true.