Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy

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Williams, Bernard, Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy, Princeton University Press, 2002, 336pp. $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691102767

Reviewed by Clancy W. Martin, University of Missouri, Kansas City


The work of Bernard Williams (1929-2003) will be argued and written about by philosophers for many years to come. He was widely viewed as one of the most (if not the most) important British philosophers of his generation, and his many noteworthy books, including such well-known works as Problems of the Self (1973), Moral Luck (1981), Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy (1985), and Shame and Necessity (1993), have deeply influenced contemporary debates about the nature of moral knowledge. We will miss him.

In Truth and Truthfulness, his last published book, Williams has left us with a powerful argument for the importance of the notion of truth to our attempts to think and talk about the world. Williams is not attempting to provide a theory of truth, he rather hopes to give us “the value of truth” (6). Williams believes that the notion of truth he will be working with reflects “everyone’s concept of truth” (271). So, rather than concentrating on truth as such, his account focuses on what he identifies as the “virtues” of truthfulness, Accuracy and Sincerity. Williams similarly insists that he is not giving us a history of the concept of truth, which is, he believes, “everywhere and always the same” (61). Instead, he will tell a story or “fictional genealogy” that explains our need for truth and truthfulness. Having done so, he proceeds to detail some of the important ethical consequences of that need, in several historical genealogies of the concepts of truth and truthfulness, and related ideas such as authenticity and self-deception.

The book is roughly divided into two parts. The first half, chapters 1 through 6, revolve around a State-of-Nature story Williams tells (in chapter 3) to illustrate and defend the importance of truth for successful human interaction. The second half, chapters 7 through 10, offers several fascinating accounts of changes in the notions of truth and truthfulness, including discussions of such figures as Herodotus and Thucydides, Rousseau and Diderot, and Habermas and Foucault.

Williams begins by identifying “The Problem”: he thinks there is a contemporary “tension between the pursuit of truthfulness and the doubt that there is (really) any truth to be found” (2). This problem has been compounded (if not created) by the “deniers” of truth, who skeptically argue that the truth is unavailable to us, or pragmatically argue that we can do all we need to do without a full-blooded notion of “Truth with a capital T.” Williams thinks we can’t do without Truth, and accordingly asks: “Can the notions of truth and truthfulness be intellectually stabilized, in such a way that what we understand about truth and our chances of arriving at it can be made to fit with our need for truthfulness?” (3).

His argument—which depends on his development of a State of Nature story or “fictional genealogy”—is simple: (a) we can’t get along without trust (human flourishing creates a “need for cooperation” [38]), (b) but trust requires truthfulness, and (c) truthfulness presupposes that there are (at least some) truths. The story Williams tells of a primitive society persuades his reader of the not terribly controversial (a), and both the State of Nature story and the book as a whole do a masterful job of defending (b). But (c) is trickier, and here I don’t think Williams succeeds in making his case.

Everyone will admit, Williams thinks, that there are some “plain truths.” In his State of Nature, “a small society of human beings sharing a common language, with no elaborate technology and no form of writing” (41), such truths are of the “Watch out! Here comes a bear” variety. Williams identifies two “virtues” of truthfulness that will emerge in such a society: “accuracy” and “sincerity.” Accuracy is the virtue of carefully investigating and deliberating over the evidence for and against a belief before assenting to it; sincerity is the virtue of genuinely expressing to others what one in fact believes. And, in the state of nature Williams imagines, the accurate and sincere reporting of truths between persons certainly seems to be necessary to the development of trust between persons, and facilitates human flourishing. Truthfulness, as Williams rightly argues, is instrumentally valuable.

But does it follow from the instrumental value of truthfulness that there are some “truths” of the sort Williams is after? Although he does not tell us what his own notion of truth is, he seems to have in mind some version of a correspondence theory of truth. When we are sincere and accurate, we arrive at truths about the way the world really is. But a State-of-Nature pragmatist might respond to Williams: suppose every time I call out “Watch out! Here comes a bear” what truly approaches is a nasty enemy combatant cunningly disguised in a bear-suit. It is easy enough to imagine experiences suffered by our State-of-Nature pragmatist that reliably substantiated such a mistaken belief. The statement, though false, is sincere, so far as the pragmatist can tell it is accurate (and here prudence is a legitimate constraint, for us and for Williams), and on Williams’ standards it is thus truthful. It serves the purposes of trust and human flourishing. It is a justified, working pragmatic belief, and yet Williams (and most of the rest of us) would count it as false. Williams’ virtues of truthfulness can provide increasingly good justifications for a belief, but unless “truth” in Williams’ sense is simply the best possible justification or justifications for a belief, it doesn’t look as though these virtues will provide the “truth”. Williams does not address the sorts of objections that a pragmatist or some other “denier” of truth might raise to his idea that truthfulness presupposes a concept of truth, and it is a shame that he doesn’t.

Williams also claims that truthfulness is intrinsically valuable, and though many of us will be inclined to agree with him, it is hard to see how his State-of-Nature story can provide truthfulness with more than instrumental value. Truthfulness in Williams’ primitive society serves the purely functional role of promoting human flourishing—and Williams’ account is interesting in part because he shows that, for purely natural reasons, truthfulness is likely to emerge as a human virtue. But, as Colin McGinn pointed out in his excellent review of Williams’ book (see below), the fact that a virtue promotes certain goods clearly does not make that virtue good in itself. The functional story Williams tells shows us that truthfulness is useful, but it does not show that it is any more than useful.

One reason we might worry about an account of truthfulness that makes it instrumentally valuable (and no doubt one reason Williams would like to provide an account of its intrinsic value) is that one can easily imagine an account of deception that makes its practice similarly instrumentally valuable. Plato’s gennaion pseudos in the Republic is justified specifically in terms of its instrumental benefits, and later thinkers such as Machiavelli, Grotius, and in our own day Arthur Sylvester (“The Government Has the Right to Lie,” Saturday Evening Post, November 18, 1967) have similarly insisted that deception is justified and even necessary to produce certain goods of human flourishing. And most of us will agree that at least some deceptive practices—such as the lie of a physician to a dying child—can be justified instrumentally.

Williams is aware of this difficulty, which brings me to chapter 5, “Sincerity: Lying and Other Styles of Deceit,” my favorite chapter in the book. Here Williams makes many valuable contributions to current philosophical thinking about deception. In a particularly interesting discussion of ways people tell lies, Williams uses Grice’s idea of “conversational implicatures” to expand the range of what counts as deception. One reason we value sincerity, he argues, is that “in relying on what someone said, one inevitably relies on more than what he said” (100). Consequently we cannot limit our discussions of deception to merely straightforward verbal lies (such as Sissela Bok attempts to do, in her groundbreaking study Lying [1989]). For Williams lies are pernicious for at least two reasons: (1) the liar betrays the trust of the dupe; and (2) the liar exerts power over the dupe, manipulating his or her beliefs and thus (potentially) his or her choices. Here Williams appeals to the (in the literature on lying, by now familiar) Kantian notion that we should treat others not “merely as a means” but also always as ends. However, Williams adds a condition of “reciprocity” (121), arguing that, contra Kant, there are some persons who do not deserve the truth.

Williams’ claim in chapter 7 that “Thucydides invented historical time” (162) struck me as less interesting, and is unfortunately argued without much evidence. If we understand the claim in a very loose and general way—that Thucydides is the first historian who looks like he uses modern methods—Williams’ idea is not very interesting, because it is only a step away from scholarly cliché. Since David Hume remarked that “The first page of Thucydides is, in my opinion, the commencement of real history,” the notion that Thucydides is the first genuinely trustworthy ancient historian has been generally accepted (even Kant agreed with Hume, here). And yet the view, cliché or no, does not seem to be correct.

Williams argues that Thucydides, as a historian, does four things that Herodotus did not do before him: (1) concerns himself with Accuracy, and thus seeks to establish facts about the past; (2) reports history with Sincerity, thus disregarding the appeal (or lack of it) to his audience; (3) invents the notion of “objective” historical time (as opposed to “mythical” time), by concerning himself with the precise ordering of events; and (4) uses the notion of objective historical time in the development of historical explanation.

Now, against Herodotus, we might grant Williams (2): Herodotus is clearly concerned with the effect his History has on his audience of Greeks (although one wonders if Thucydides was not similarly concerned). But (1), (3) and (4) are all accomplished in Herodotus’ work: (1) by the time of his account of the Persian wars Herodotus has his dating down fairly accurately; (3) he is specifically concerned with the ordering of events and has the Greek notion of the Olympiad for establishing that order; and (4) he is clearly concerned with historical explanation—he tells his history just to explain how the Greeks, a loose collection of squabbling tribes, could have possibly defeated the greatest army on Earth. Williams thinks that Thucydides is the first to “link time, truth, and causal explanation” (154), but these elements seem already to be thoughtfully linked in Herodotus. Of course, the “who did it first” question is not a particularly interesting one; but Williams puts a stress on it because he believes that Thucydides introduces a new, “objective” way of understanding history. Williams’ Thucydides is supposed to provide an example of how “Truth” appears in historical accounts, out of a concern for Sincerity and Accuracy. If the example succeeded, it would provide a nice instance of “true genealogy” bearing out Williams’ “fictional genealogy.” But it does not succeed in distinguishing between Thucydides and Herodotus, and in so failing it casts doubt on the thesis that the notion of “objective” time emerges with any particular thinker (rather than, say, as part of a much larger cultural process).

Much better is his account, in chapter 8, of the differences between Rousseau and Diderot on the questions of self-knowledge and “what it takes to be a truthful person” (173). Williams persuasively argues that, for Rousseau, to be a truthful person one need only be completely sincere, and self-knowledge lay in the frank revelation of one’s deep dark secrets (thus his Confessions). This, Williams thinks, gives us a distorted view of the self, by assuming a transparency of consciousness that simply does not exist. The better account of selfhood is given by Rousseau’s contemporary and sometime friend Diderot, who (like Nietzsche and Freud after him) describes coming to know oneself as a difficult, lifelong project of self-creation and stabilization. The self as it is given to us “is awash with many images, many excitements, merging fears and fantasies that dissolve into one another” (195), and the attempt to sort through and manage that refractory collection is the struggle for authenticity. Williams goes on to give his own (unfortunately, brief) account of authenticity, both before oneself and with one’s community, in terms of “beliefs … which [an agent] is committed to holding true in the context of his deliberation” (196). Here he provocatively argues that the many different forms of “wishful thinking” are not (as is often thought) impediments to the creation of an authentic self, but essential to the process of “individual deliberation” that alone allows such a self to develop.

There is much more here: a fascinating discussion of Habermas, Foucault, and the importance of truth in politics (chapter 9), an excellent, and fundamentally sympathetic, critique of Hayden White’s analysis of historiography (chapter 10), and a wonderful endnote unraveling the complications of the notoriously knotty ancient Greek word for truth, Aletheia. I recommend the book to other philosophers with genuine enthusiasm: as with Williams’ previous books, the breadth of learning is so large, and the generosity, wit and incisiveness of the intelligence so compelling, that any reader will leave the book with a feeling of intellectual refreshment. Naturally, I have focused on those aspects of the book that particularly caught my own interest; others will find much that I have missed.

This book has been widely reviewed and praised. I recommend the interested reader of this review to two other reviews of particular note: Richard Rorty’s “To the Sunlit Uplands” (London Review of Books, Vol. 24 No.21, October 31, 2002) and Colin McGinn’s “Isn’t it the Truth?” (The New York Review of Books, Vol. L, No. 6, April 10, 2003). Rorty’s review focuses on Williams’ attacks on pragmatism and the “deniers” of truth (including, of course, himself); McGinn’s review is particularly helpful on the role of truth (as opposed to truthfulness) in Williams’ book. Both reviews were valuable sources for the present review.